The Oxford Handbook of the Philosophy of Death

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Ben Bradley, Fred Feldman, and Jens Johansson (eds.), The Oxford Handbook of the Philosophy of Death, Oxford University Press, 2012, 528pp., $150.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195388923.

Reviewed by Mark Alfino, Gonzaga University


The editors have chosen to emphasize work on death from an analytical and metaphysical perspective. Not all of the 21 articles in this 500-page collection reflect this approach to the same degree. As we shall see, the editors' methodological orientation brings out some distinctive and interesting work. This volume will be of particular interest to philosophers who want to explore the way death challenges our commitments to concepts and theories of personal identity, time, and harm, as well as the way in which metaphysical possibility can help us explore some of the questions we want to ask about death. The latter include "When do things die?" (also the title of the first article) and "Is there anything about me that could survive death?". Questions about the kinds of harm that death causes or can cause arise in a number of articles, including Steven Luper's, "Retroactive Harms and Wrongs." Another theme in the text, which reflects the continuing importance of Epicurean thought to a philosophy of death, is Epicurus' challenging thesis that "Death is nothing to us." A very interesting article by Alastair Norcross near the end of the collection asks whether death has the same significance for animals and humans.

One of the most helpful articles, particularly for orienting the reader to its dominant methodological approach, is Theodore Sider's "The Evil of Death: What Can Metaphysics Contribute?" In straightforward, relatively non-technical language, Sider explains how metaphysicians approach the problem of death and how, for example, the problem of time is connected with it. This article would have worked well at the start of the collection since so many other articles engage some of the problems it raises or work from a similar metaphysical approach.

One expectation that an analytic and/or metaphysical approach is unlikely to satisfy, of course, is the desire for rich information about philosophical cultures that have addressed death. The volume's focus is the set of potential problems raised by our conceptual schemes for talking about death. It was a pleasant surprise, then, to find Gareth Matthews' "Death in Socrates, Plato, and Aristotle". It is a clear and professional historical reconstruction of the treatment of death in classical Greek philosophy. Despite the size of the collection, perhaps there was no room for consideration of any other philosophical traditions on death aside from the Greeks. This is somewhat unfortunate given how often the topic of "annihilationism" (the idea that we cease to exist after death) comes up in other articles. Buddhist scholarship on this topic is extensive.

Two of the longest articles (55-60 pages, compared to an average of about 20 for the others) have the deepest roots in analytic metaphysics. The lead article, Cody Gilmore's "When Do Things Die?", is a search for metaphysically necessary conditions for a thing to die. Gilmore discusses the connections between philosophies of time and death (as do several later articles). For presentists, who believe things cease to exist when they cease to be present, death is a different problem than for eternalists on time, who think that all moments in time are equally real. Gilmore considers logical features of a variety of terms before eventually focusing on "irreversibility." At the end of his analysis, "being dead" means roughly "having died and having not regained the capacity to live since then" (Gilmore 44). This will strike some as a lot of work for small gain, but Gilmore claims also to have uncovered some nonobvious connections about "how dying and being dead are related to other notions in the vicinity" (44). The other very long article, Dean Zimmerman's "Personal Identity and the Survival of Death," takes on the fascinating question of what it is about me that might survive death. That question is framed within a complex discussion of the "doctrine of temporal parts," a metaphysical speculation (with its own literature) which helps Zimmerman account for the possibility of personal identity surviving death. He acknowledges that a God is still needed to help us with the change that might be required to survive death.

One has the feeling, with articles like these, that the putative topic of the article, in this case death, is not always the main focus. Sometimes it seems that the logical and metaphysical possibilities that things could take turn out to be more interesting to the author than the likely physical realities that govern the phenomena. And many of the authors are very clear about the modesty of the conclusions they want to draw about death. Often what is valued in this sort of philosophical literature is showing that a possibility thought to be extremely unlikely may be less so, or that a set of possible solutions are explored without tremendous concern about a resolution or practical outcome. These are probably costs of the method and culture of analytic work such as this, but it could be a source of frustration to readers who want to explore, for example, what current knowledge about death and dying tell us about how to think about life and death, which is, of course, another interpretation of "philosophy of death".

So considerable license should be granted in reading some of the articles, since the exploration of metaphysical possibilities can lead us to places where a naturalist, for example, might not easily follow. Consider Fred Feldman's "Death and the Disintegration of Personality," which addresses the question of whether there are "dead persons" (that is, whether when people die they cease to exist). This leads to a metaphysical hunt for the property of being a person, which Feldman identifies with personality. He would like a logically clear concept of personality, which is already a tall order, and he casts about for answers among categories of possibilities such as biological, psychological, and moral conceptions of personality. When it comes to thinking about personality as biological, Feldman suggests, without citation, that there is a great deal of controversy about "who is to count as a human being" (62) apparently because there may be more than one subspecies of homo sapien and it is not clear "how the concept of 'human being' is supposed to connect to these groupings" (62).

There are many controversies in biology and physical anthropology, but I do not think this is one of them. Biologists define species more pragmatically than Feldman, and would not be likely to wonder "which species" have the property of human nature. "Human nature" can also refer to a set of concepts that might be chosen with a pragmatic research interest in mind. A more typical way of asking this question today might be, "Which of the characteristics of being human that we are interested in are found in which species?" This takes a bit of the air out of the sense of metaphysical discovery. Today we would think of the biological identity of an organism as the combination of its genes and development. When Feldman moves on to consider psychological approaches, we have to wonder how they vary from biological approaches. Our psychology is, after all, a part of our biology, though there may be possible worlds in which it is not. Further, I do not think that psychologists would say that a psychological theory of personality involves "some trait or ability, P, such that to say that something is a person is to say that it has P" (66). In any case, if Feldman's exploration is fraught with difficulties, it also comes to some pretty modest conclusions, since no concept of personality is ultimately established in the piece. Still, Feldman provides a good exploration (and example of) of the corpse/annihilationist debate in analytic metaphysics.

Eric Olson ("The Person and the Corpse") also addresses the corpse/annihilationist debate, framing it by showing us why we should care about each alternative. In Olson's well-written article, it becomes clear that our traditional metaphysical assumptions about the uniqueness of human nature are at stake. If we become corpses after we die, then our uniqueness and metaphysical status is that of an object. Annihilation may not sound attractive, but it holds out the possibility of a kind of metaphysical uniqueness such that we have life, but do not become a dead thing. By the end of the article, Olson is discussing "corpse eliminativism," the possibility that talk of corpses is just a "convenient fiction" (94). This is another point at which a connection to other traditions of thought on death would have been helpful. Buddhists, for example, have a well-developed distinction between conventional and ultimate truths, also regarding the self.

There are too many articles in the collection to comment on in a short review. Readers will find good analytic work on ideas from Epicurus in a number of articles, including John Broome's excellently written, "The Badness of Death and the Goodness of Life," which, like many of the best articles in the volume, has a strong sense of audience. A classic argument from Epicurus suggests that you cannot be harmed by death because you do not exist when death is present. Broome argues that Epicurus' philosophy does not ultimately provide support for this claim.

This Handbook will introduce readers to some recent analytic work on the philosophy of death. It is more a guide to this philosophical literature more than to philosophies of death. Those who approach the volume in this way should expect some interesting and satisfying philosophical challenges. I found it very helpful to read about the connection between philosophies of time and death, for example. The treatments of personal identity and death are thorough and also cut across a number of the articles.

But the limits of a metaphysical approach to death are also, and perhaps necessarily, reflected in the book. The topic of death is often left behind in the interests of metaphysics. Epicurus, for example, is not understood as giving advice about our attitude toward death, but as making and defending metaphysical claims. Naturalism, continental thought, and world thought are conspicuously absent, as is Transhumanism. But there is a point at which this is just a complaint that it is not a different kind of handbook.

A complete philosophy of death that we might use to face death is likely to require not only the resources metaphysics has for speculating about death, but also philosophical resources for understanding how we have come to think of death and whether this approach is still justified. Our death is both an event which defines a crucial aspect of our personal lives and an event that is itself partially defined in cultural terms. Questions about the loss that death involves, the sorts of desires that make death bad, and even whether it is a bad thing that we die require analyses that are sensitive to empirical evidence, anthropology, and biology, and which help us model not only the metaphysics of any view of death, but the experience of death as something which structures meaning in our lives.