The Oxford Handbook of Value Theory

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Iwao Hirose and Jonas Olson (eds.), The Oxford Handbook of Value Theory, Oxford University Press, 2015, 448pp., $150.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199959303.

Reviewed by Errol Lord, University of Pennsylvania, and Kurt Sylvan, University of Southampton


This handbook collects a nice assortment of papers on value theory, ranging from papers about highly abstract structural features of axiology to applied topics. It is, we think, a helpful addition to the literature. Many of the papers are excellent. Some provide useful summaries of debates -- though not always for the uninitiated -- while others are pitched at experts, advancing exciting new views and arguments. The volume will, we are sure, be useful for teaching the debates, especially at the graduate level.

Before turning to a detailed summary and some critical remarks, let us register two reservations. The first is about the book's purpose. The editors tell us that the 'purpose [of the handbook] is to offer a critical overview of the central topics in value theory that is both comprehensive and up to date' (1). Let there be no doubt about it, the book has many up-to-date papers on central topics. That said, the authors don't always share the same ambitions. Some want to make serious progress; others have written more encyclopedic papers. This makes the reader a little confused about what the volume is supposed to be doing.

Our second remark concerns comprehensiveness. Of course, no book, not even one of this size, can be completely comprehensive. Nevertheless, several omissions strike us as significant. First, there is no dedicated paper on fitting attitudes accounts of value. It is hard not noticing this omission as the fitting attitudes account comes up repeatedly in the volume. Second, there is no paper on what fundamentally bears value, though this topic is in the background of many papers. Third, there is no paper devoted to the debate between teleologists and non-teleologists about value in the sense of T. M. Scanlon (Chapter 2), though this debate bears importantly on many issues discussed in the volume (we return to this below). Finally, it would have been nice to have a piece on the debate between person-affecting and impersonal conceptions of value. Familiarity with this debate is assumed by several pieces (e.g., on justice and population axiology), but it merits the foreground.

We will split the remainder of the review into two parts, first providing summaries of the papers, then some critical comments.


In 'Value and Normativity', Michael J. Zimmerman explores various attempts to connect deontic concepts like rightness to evaluative concepts like goodness. He first considers the consequentialist's attempt to understand rightness in terms of goodness. After cataloging various problems for this project, he defends the idea that any moral theory can be consequentialized via the concept of deontic goodness. He then considers fitting attitude theorists' attempts to understand goodness in terms of deontic concepts like fittingness. He catalogues various problems for this before pointing out that fitting attitude accounts are compatible with consequentialism as long as fittingness and rightness are distinct.

Toni Rønnow-Rasmussen's 'Intrinsic and Extrinsic Value' begins by examining the multiple ways in which the distinction has been understood. He lists three ways: as (i) final vs. non-final value, (ii) value that supervenes on intrinsic properties vs. value that doesn't, and (iii) value that needs to be justified by other values vs. value that doesn't. He regards each as useful but treats (i) as the most central. He then turns to examining the nature of non-final value, noting that it may be a broader category than instrumental value. He draws attention to symbolic, signatory, and constitutive value as examples of non-final but non-instrumental value. He concludes with a brief discussion of the 'coherence' of the intrinsic/extrinsic value distinction, focusing on skepticism about intrinsic value inspired by Geach's doubts about predicative goodness.

Jonas Olson picks up this topic at length in 'Doubts about Intrinsic Value'. Singling out Moore as a key target, Olson devotes the first two sections to considering Moore's claims about intrinsic value. He highlights two claims from Principia Ethica: Unanalyzability and Uniqueness, the latter of which holds that the concept of intrinsic goodness is the sole unanalysable ethical concept. Olson notes that Moore abandoned Uniqueness in later work, and surveys early rejections of Unanalyzability by Ewing and Broad. After this historical excursus, he considers two doubts about intrinsic value from Kraut and Thomson: (i) that it is normatively redundant, and (ii) that we can make sense of it only if there is such a thing as 'absolute', predicative goodness. Olson observes that the Moorean tenets about intrinsic value don't require that intrinsic goodness is itself a reason-giving property. He also notes that Thomson's case for (ii) is plausible only granting Unanalyzability, and can be forestalled by a fitting attitudes account.

In 'Value and Desires,' Graham Oddie considers whether we desire things because they're good or they're good because we desire them. He explicates two different views that reduce value to desires. He explores several interesting strategies for making the resulting value agent-neutral and catalogs the numerous problems for idealism. He then considers various realist views of value, including fitting attitudes accounts. He catalogs some problems with these accounts before exploring the idea that desires are perceptions of the good. He argues that such a view has serious benefits, though it raises some important objections.

Christine Tappolet in 'Value and Emotions' explores the connections between emotional and evaluative concepts. She's interested in value-emotion equivalences such as the claim that x is admirable if and only if feeling admiration is appropriate in response to x. She argues that perceptual theories of emotion can solve the wrong kind of reason problem for accounts of appropriateness. Finally, she considers valence variability arguments that suggest that affective concepts are not inherently evaluative. She argues that these arguments do not succeed by appealing to tools developed in the literature on thick concepts.

Garrett Cullity's 'Neutral and Relative Value' considers whether there is such a thing as agent-relative goodness and what it might be. He argues that we can make sense of agent-relative goodness if we link value and fitting pro-attitudes and allow that fittingness is a three-place relation with a slot for an agent. He then asks whether this notion enables consequentialists to vindicate commonsense morality. Whether it can also turns on, he observes, how we understand the contrasting notion of neutral value. Cullity walks through four ways of understanding neutral value that leave the agent-relative consequentialist with problems and suggests that understanding neutral value as what is fittingly valued by an impartial spectator avoids them. He concludes with a discussion of whether agent-relative consequentialism is vacuous (he says 'no') and whether it is plausible on the whole ('no' again).

In 'Value and Time,' Krister Bykvist explores two questions about the relationship between value and time. The first concerns the time of value. This divides into two subquestions, one about the temporal location of bearers of value and one about the temporal location of value itself. It is obvious, he notes, that some bearers of value have a temporal location: my pleasure in reading Bykvist's paper occurred at a time, and it had value. Nevertheless, he argues, it's not clear whether all bearers of value have a temporal location. Atemporal objects like mathematical theorems or God are counterexamples. Bykvist demonstrates that it's important to determine whether value itself has a temporal location by discussing the debate about the badness of death, which is largely focused on the temporal location, if any, of the badness of one's death. The second main question he discusses is the value of time. He is interested in whether any temporal relations are evaluatively relevant in themselves, exploring durations, life-periods, and temporal order. He ends by discussing puzzles involving time bias.

Chris Heathwood's 'Monism and Pluralism about Value' catalogues the varieties of axiological monism and pluralism and reviews some familiar arguments for both views. He begins with a helpful distinction between (a) the monism/pluralism debate about value properties, which focuses on the relative fundamentality of properties like goodness simpliciter and goodness-for, and (b) the debate between substantive monists and pluralists, which focuses on what things in a value category have basic intrinsic value in that category. He also mentions a radical pluralist view on which there are several substantive values, each of which instantiates a different kind of value property. Heathwood then rehearses four arguments: [1] the 'straightforward argument' for pluralism, which is a conjunction of arguments for thinking that various kinds of things are intrinsically valuable, [2] the explanatory inadequacy argument against pluralism, [3] the 'uncompensability' argument, on which the fact that losses of some goods cannot be compensated by gains in other goods suggests that these goods are good in different ways, and [4] arguments both for and against pluralism from (in)comparability. He finds [1-4] all indecisive.

Valerie Tiberius (in 'Prudential Value') surveys views about goodness-for. She evaluates theories with respect to how well they (i) capture the subject-relativity of goodness-for and (ii) how well they capture the normativity of goodness-for. She starts with objectivist theories, which hold that goodness-for is not determined by idiosyncratic features of the agent. These views capture the normativity of goodness-for but have a hard time securing the subject-relativity of goodness-for. She then considers subjectivist views, which hold that goodness-for is determined by the desires of the agent. These have an easy time accounting for subject-relativity but a hard time accounting for normativity. She ends by discussing and partially defending internalist views, which hold, like objectivist views, that goodness-for is not determined by one's desires but also hold, like the subjectivist, that goodness-for is determined by facts about the particular agent. She argues that these views have a better shot at accounting for both subject-relativity and normativity.

In 'Kantian Axiology and the Dualism of Practical Reason', Ralf M. Bader explicates a novel dualist Kantian axiology that avoids Sidgwick's dualism about practical reason. Bader's axiology is dualist because it holds that moral value and prudential value are different kinds of value. Dualism in this sense threatens to entail dualism about practical reason. If the values are different in kind, then it's hard to see how we can compare the values in order to determine all things considered facts. Bader argues against weakening the dualism by introducing a so-called covering value that allows for comparisons. Instead, he holds that prudential value is conditioned on certain moral facts. In particular, whether, e.g., some fact about happiness constitutes prudential value is conditioned on whether one has a good will. If one does not have a good will, then that fact is silenced and does not constitute prudential value. This allows Bader to construct a deflationary unindexed betterness relation that allows for comparisons between moral and prudential value, thus avoiding dualism about practical reason.

In 'Value Incomparability and Incommensurability,' Ruth Chang begins by arguing that incomparability is the more important of the two titular phenomena, and then elucidates the phenomenon and considers the arguments for and against its possibility. Incommensurability is less significant, she suggests, because few plausible ethical theories assume commensurability. After distinguishing incomparability from parity, indeterminacy, and formal failures of comparability, thereby casting doubt on some reasons for thinking there is incomparability, Chang defends a comparativist view of rational choice. She notes that opponents of comparativism have tended to make assumptions about comparability that can be rejected. Comparativism, she argues, underwrites an intuitively appealing account of the relation between value, reasons, and action, while the main alternative -- maximalism -- lacks intuitive support and rests on a conflation.

Gustaf Arrhenius and Wlodek Rabinowicz ('Value Superiority') discuss the rejection of the 'Archimedean' property for value -- i.e., that for any values A and B, there is for any amount of A some amount of B that is at least as good. They review two reasons for rejecting Archimedeanism -- first, as a way of avoiding the Repugnant Conclusion, and second, as a way to secure Millian intuitions about the contribution that different pleasures make to overall welfare, pleasantness, or impersonal value. The authors don't evaluate these reasons, however, but rather turn to technical observations about strong and weak value superiority; the former holds between A and B when any amount of A is better than any amount of B, and the latter when some amount of A is better than any amount of B. They summarize some formal results about both that are proven in six appendices. This paper may be the least accessible in the volume.

In 'General and Personal Good: Harsanyi's Contribution to the Theory of Value,' John Broome explicates, interprets, and defends Harsanyi's theorem that 'general utility can be treated as the total of personal utilities' (251). More precisely, Harsanyi's theorem shows that 'general betterness can be represented by a utility function that is the sum of utility functions that represent the personal betterness of each person' (ibid). Broome nicely brings out two surprising implications of this. First, if one thinks that personal good is risk averse, then Harsanyi's theorem implies that prioritarianism is true about general good. Second, if one thinks that personal good is risk neutral, then a utilitarian value function holds about general good. Broome goes on to first defend the premises of Harsanyi's theorem before arguing that utility is goodness itself, which implies risk neutrality and thus a utilitarian value function.

Nils Holtug considers justice from an axiological angle in 'Theories of Value Aggregation', beginning with utilitarian attempts to defend equality by appeal to diminishing marginal utility and to answer the 'separateness of persons' objection. After concluding that there are significant problems with these utilitarian efforts, He surveys the debate between axiological egalitarians and prioritarians. He favors a minimal characterization of egalitarianism on which an outcome is in one respect non-instrumentally better when it is more equal and suggests that even this view faces a significant challenges from the levelling down objection, which he ultimately finds persuasive. In discussing prioritarianism, Holtug focuses on whether it really circumvents the levelling down objection (he says 'yes') and on whether it fails to respect the separateness of persons (he says 'no'). The chapter concludes with a brief discussion about whether prioritarianism and some versions of egalitarianism are too aggregative. Holtug maintains that it is unclear whether we can avoid the aggregative features of these theories without falling into the excessive non-aggregation of Rawls-inspired approaches.

Erik Carlson's 'Organic Unities' begins with an attempt to make sense of Moore's claims about organic unities. He argues that Moore's claims are either false or meaningless. Carlson observes that Moore's suggestion that the value of a whole is sometimes not identical to the sum of the values of its parts is meaningful only if value can be measured on a ratio scale, on which comparative value relations satisfy principles of monotonicity, associativity and commutativity. Unfortunately for Moore, these constraints also imply that the value of a whole must be identical to the sum of the values of its parts. So Carlson suggests that 'meaninglessness is the right verdict' (289) since plausible axiologies will violate these principles. Carlson turns to alternative ways of characterizing organicity, which involve rejecting monotonicity, associativity, or commutativity, and then considers contextualist views on which the value of a whole is the sum of the values of its parts, but where the values of the parts are themselves determined by relations to other parts of the whole. He doesn't decide between these options, but concludes with optimism that there are (non-Moorean) organic unities, given that the disjunction of these views is plausible.

In 'Skepticism about Value Aggregation', Iwao Hirose evaluates the arguments against aggregation in axiology and the attempts by non-aggregative theorists to construct alternatives that solve the 'number problem'. He canvasses four arguments against aggregation: (i) counterexample-based arguments, (ii) arguments from the separateness of persons, (iii) arguments from organic unities, and (iv) arguments from skepticism about betterness simpliciter. None of (i-iv) is found convincing, and (i) and (ii) meet with close critique. Hirose then considers two positive non-aggregative accounts -- Nagel's unanimity through pairwise comparisons account and Scanlon's contractualism. While Hirose thinks Scanlon fares better than Nagel, he finds Scanlon's crucial tie-breaking argument unsuccessful. Hirose concludes by considering two solutions to the number problem that he finds more convincing, but also more limited.

Matthew D. Adler's 'Value and Cost-Benefit Analysis' examines some of the philosophical assumptions behind the implementation of cost benefit analysis (CBA) by economists and governments. His focus is twofold. First, he examines the various 'rationality constraints' that economists impose on preferences in order to get an ordering with virtuous formal properties. He argues that extant constraints are dubious on both philosophical and empirical grounds. Second, he considers the motivations for CBA. Many are motivated to adopt CBA because they want to eschew interpersonal value comparisons. This path has led many to hold that the counterfactual Kaldor-Hicks test is a test of an outcome's goodness. Adler argues that this is a mistake because it's not clear why the relevant counterfactual property should make an actual outcome good. To get around this problem, one needs some ranking function that can make interpersonal comparisons. So at the end of the day he thinks CBA cannot avoid interpersonal comparisons.

Daniel M. Hausman's main concern in 'The Value of Health' is how we develop a measure of health in order to make comparisons between outcomes in the aid of policy. Although health comes in degrees, Hausman argues that we cannot directly measure health because it does not have its own quantitative magnitude. The natural place to turn is value. Hausman argues that the value of health does not supervene on the health state-types of individuals. This is because there can be individuals that have type-identical health states that nevertheless differ in value. To overcome this problem he explores several supervenience principles involving token rather than type health states.

Prasanta K. Pattanaik and Yongsheng Xu's 'Freedom and its Value' discusses the nature and value of liberty as understood in political philosophy. They begin by elucidating the concept of freedom, discussing the nature of options, constraints, and provisos on freedom, and reviewing work in political philosophy that may be unfamiliar to many axiologists. Their next and shortest section discusses the instrumental and intrinsic value of freedom. The discussion is narrow and condensed, which we found surprising given the focus of the volume. They then turn to a lengthy discussion of the measurement of freedom and its value and conclude with some reflections on opportunity sets, highlighting their own work on the topic.

In 'Value in Nature', David Schmidtz focuses on three debates in environmental ethics. The first is whether objects in nature can have non-instrumental value. Here he considers debates about the objectivity of intrinsic value and whether nature can have non-relative intrinsic value. The second debate concerns the scope of objects with moral standing. Views range widely on this issue, with some holding that only moral agents like humans can have moral standing, others holding that every living thing has moral standing, and yet others maintaining that non-individuals like species can have moral standing. The final debate concerns whether value in nature is always commensurable. Schmidtz argues that it's important to insist that all value in nature is commensurable even if some values are not. This is important, in his view, because we need to be able to decide how to protect and promote value in nature.

M. A. Roberts tackles the problems of population ethics and defends her person-based variabilist approach in 'Population Axiology'. She begins by reminding us why total utilitarianism invites the Repugnant Conclusion and average utilitarianism creates other serious problems. Roberts notes that pluralism won't solve these problems without a lexical ranking or capping strategy, possibilities to which she returns in the final section. She recommends sticking to a person-based view that respects Jan Narveson's thought that it is making people happy, not making happy people, that matters morally. On her view, a world Y is worse than a world X only if Y is worse for someone, where, crucially, the relevant comparison world may be distinct from X. She also defends her variabilist claim that a person's having a lower level of well-being at a world X than at some other world accessible from X matters morally only if this person exists at X. The person-based aspect of the view blocks the Repugnant Conclusion, while the variabilist aspect secures Narveson's asymmetry and diminishes the non-identity problem. Roberts admits, however, that the view doesn't fully solve the non-identity problem.

In 'The Value of Existence,' Arrhenius and Rabinowicz explore the question of whether existence itself can be good or bad for a person. A classic argument for a negative answer to this question has as a premise the claim that if existence is better (or worse) for a person, then failing to exist would have been worse (or better) for that person. Since it's seemingly absurd for something to be better or worse for a non-existent person, critics conclude that existence itself cannot be better or worse for a person. Arrhenius and Rabinowicz argue that that premise is false. Some things, they claim, can be better (or worse) for a person even if it's not the case that not having those things would have been worse (or better) for her. They note that this is in tension with the view that 'An outcome A is better for a person p than another outcome B if and only if p would have higher welfare in A than in B' (430). To show that this view is not the only game in town, they defend an alternative, fitting attitudes, account of better-for. According to this view, 'A is better for p than B if and only if one ought to prefer A to B for p's sake' (431).

Critical Remarks

In the remainder of the review, we will discuss a few issues more critically.

We will first consider the response that Oddie and Tappolet make to the wrong kind of reasons (WKR) problem. Oddie is concerned with this problem because he is interested in accounts that reduce goodness to facts about fitting desires. He is led to the idea that a desire that p is fitting if and only if one ought to/has most reason to desire p. This analysis of fittingness invites the WKR problem. Just imagine that an evil demon has promised to torture you if you do not desire a saucer of mud. It is natural to think you ought to so desire the saucer of mud even if it is not desirable. Tappolet is interested in fitting attitudes analyses of notions like admirableness. This leads her to the idea that 'x is admirable if and only if feeling admiration is appropriate [i.e. fitting] in response to x' (83). This analysis also raises the WKR problem.

Oddie and Tappolet propose the same solution (the idea is inspired by Tappolet (2011)). Both maintain that one can avoid the WKR problem by holding a perceptual view of conative states. The basic idea behind the perceptual view is that conative states present their objects as having various evaluative properties. Desires present their objects as being good, admiration presents its object as admirable, etc. Oddie and Tappolet maintain that one can solve the WKR problem by insisting that a conative attitude is fitting just in case its object is the way the state represents it to be.

As they both point out, making this move seems to rule out accounts that reduce goodness, admirableness, fearsomeness, etc., to facts about fittingness. This is because fittingness itself is analyzed in terms of goodness, admirableness, etc. They each have interesting things to say about this. We pass over this because what we are most interested in pointing out is that it is difficult to see how this solves the wrong kind of reasons problem. This is because the notion of fittingness they are appealing to is all-things-considered, not contributory. The WKR problem, though, is at least partly about contributory notions like reasons.

Notice that while beliefs present their objects as true and it is plausible that a belief is correct only if true, no one has thought that these points eliminate the WKR problem for belief. We need to tie reason-giving facts to the correctness condition in the right way to solve the WKR problem. And solving this problem is important because no matter what one thinks about the project of reducing goodness or admirableness to facts about fittingness, one should think there is a tight connection between what it's rational to desire or admire or what one ought to desire and admire and the right kind of reasons to desire or admire. (To be clear, we are neutral here about whether the notion of fittingness they appeal to is important. We just want to make clear that there is a WKR problem that this move does not help with.)

Let's turn to a second set of issues. As we noted in the introduction, the volume would have benefited from greater attention to the contrast between teleological and non-teleological conceptions of value. Recall how Elizabeth Anderson (1993) and Scanlon (1998) denied that to be valuable is to be something that is 'to be promoted' and observed that some values call not for promotion but rather a non-teleological response, such as respect. When a non-teleological approach of this stripe is taken seriously, some problems discussed in the volume look markedly different.

Consider the alleged problems for egalitarianism. Holtug assumes that in viewing equality as intrinsically valuable, egalitarians are committed to thinking that there is an underivative reason to promote the property of equality in distributions of welfare. This commitment invites the leveling down objection. But this is not a mandatory commitment if egalitarians reject the teleological conception of value. Following Anderson (1999), one could unpack the claim that equality is intrinsically valuable in the claim that we have underivative reasons to treat others as equals. Equality is a value we express in our relations to others and not -- or not fundamentally -- a property of distributions to be maximized. So understood, egalitarianism doesn't invite the leveling down objection. While this egalitarianism might suffer from other problems, it is striking that it is ignored, especially given that it is a familiar line in political philosophy. This omission is, we think, the consequence of a broader omission -- viz., ignoring the Anderson/Scanlon line on value.

Now consider population axiology. Population axiologists take themselves to face a dilemma: opt for a person-affecting conception of value and face the non-identity problem or opt for an impersonal conception of value and face the repugnant conclusion. Lurking behind this dilemma is the assumption that if correctly responding to a value V doesn't necessarily promote someone's welfare, and incorrectly responding to V doesn't necessarily demote anyone's welfare, V isn't a person-affecting value. Since 'person-affecting' is a technical term, one might concede this claim, but one needn't thereby grant that V is an impersonal value of the kind that invites the repugnant conclusion. For V could be person-based without being person-affecting in this narrow sense. The bad decisions made in non-identity cases intuitively manifest disregard for people, and this intuition remains even if we notice that the affected persons owe their existence to the decision; compare Woodward's (1986) example of a black person who is unintentionally saved due to being discriminatorily prevented from boarding a plane that crashes. So we can explain what is going amiss in non-identity cases by appealing to a failure to correctly respond to value without thereby invoking the kind of impersonal value that invites the Repugnant Conclusion. Refusing to grant that teleologists are right about value even if wrong about rightness makes a difference again.

Teleology about value plays a significant role elsewhere in the volume. In treating the final/non-final value distinction as the most important way of drawing the intrinsic/extrinsic distinction, Rønnow-Rasmussen makes a significant concession to the teleologist; in focusing on basic final value, Heathwood makes a similar concession. Final value is value as an end or goal, and such value is 'to be promoted'. But some paradigm examples of intrinsic value are not final values. 'Kingdom of ends' talk aside, the sense in which persons are intrinsically valuable is not the sense in which pleasure, if it is a final value, is intrinsically valuable. While Rønnow-Rasmussen later draws attention to forms of derivative value that aren't instrumental (e.g., symbolic value), there are more important examples (e.g., the good of valuing the good). These examples undermine the significance of the final/non-final distinction and recommend making a different distinction central -- say, the fundamental/derived distinction. The same point is suggested by Heathwood's discussion of the monism/pluralism debate. While he focuses on final values, he restricts them to basic final values. Isn't it then the basic/non-basic distinction that is more important? Of course, hard work remains in clarifying this distinction. But this volume isn't a bad place for it to be done.

Concluding Remarks

While we have expressed a few minor reservations about the scope, goals, and content of this volume, overall we think that it is a fine addition to the literature. It is well worth reading for both seasoned axiologists and graduate students working in ethics, and it provides a terrific sampling of the state of the art.


Anderson, E. 1993. Value in Ethics and Economics. Harvard University Press.

Anderson, E. 1999. 'What is the Point of Equality?' Ethics 109: 287-337.

Scanlon, T. M. 1998. What We Owe to Each Other. Harvard University Press.

Tappolet, C. 2011. 'Values and Emotions: Neo-Sentimentalism's Prospects' in Bagnoli, C. (ed.) Morality and the Emotions. Oxford University Press.

Woodward, J. 1986. 'The Non-Identity Problem.' Ethics 96: 804-31.