The Perfectionist Turn: From Metanorms to Metaethics

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Douglas J. Den Uyl and Douglas B. Rasmussen, The Perfectionist Turn: From Metanorms to Metaethics, Edinburgh University Press, 2016, 346 pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781474413343.

Reviewed by Justin Tosi, Georgetown University


Philosophers who defend perfectionist accounts of the human good and then go on to develop political theories tend to favor political institutions that promote that view of the good. In other words, political philosophers tend to be perfectionists all the way down, or not at all. Douglas Den Uyl and Douglas Rasmussen are an exception to this rule. In an earlier work, they argued for a neo-Aristotelian perfectionist foundation for political liberalism.[1] Here they develop in greater detail the ethical doctrine of "individualistic perfectionism" that serves as the basis of their political theory.

Den Uyl and Rasmussen cast ethical theorizing as proceeding from a choice between two "templates" (which they also refer to as "orientations" and "frameworks"): a template of respect, and a template of responsibility. These templates "provide the central or orienting characteristics of the problem, and thereby guide one in reaching the kinds of answers likely to be acceptable" (3). The template of respect takes the chief concern of ethics to be the development of norms of conduct to facilitate our living with one another. On the authors' telling, this template is home to Kantian and utilitarian moral theories. The template of responsibility, on the other hand, treats as fundamental the "existential fact that we must make something of our lives" (2). Den Uyl and Rasmussen's individualistic perfectionism falls under this latter template.

The book has two parts. Part I introduces the basic details of individualistic perfectionism, and uses the resources of the theory to justify Den Uyl and Rasmussen's separation of ethics and politics into distinct domains. Part II further develops and defends individualistic perfectionism. There, the authors work out their metaethics of virtue and use constructivism as a foil for presenting some strengths of their theory.

Den Uyl and Rasmussen's individualistic perfectionism, like many other perfectionist theories, identifies the good for human beings with the development or flourishing of natural human capacities, or human nature. Their view is distinctive for the particular combination of properties it assigns to the human good. On individualistic perfectionism, the good is agent-relative (i.e. there is no impersonal good, only good for). Their account of flourishing is inclusive, in that human flourishing is conceived of as a final end that comprises all human goods. Flourishing is highly individualized: "the concrete character of human flourishing is dependent on who one is as well as what one is" (41, emphasis in original). Critically, flourishing requires self-direction, and cannot simply be imposed from without. Human flourishing is also social -- only attainable by living with and among other people. And finally, though their conception of the good is plural, complex, and fine-grained to the circumstances of individual persons, it is objective. It is possible for a person to be mistaken about what is good for her.

Owing to its emphasis on individuality, Den Uyl and Rasmussen's perfectionism can yield only a very limited set of universal ethical guidelines. Since we are each subject to widely varying sets of practical reasons corresponding to our highly individuated, agent-relative goods, it is impossible to get an ambitious juridical model of morality off the ground. Their theory can, however, recognize the possibility of "metanorms" -- norms that "regulate the conditions under which moral conduct may take place" (93). Here the presence of self-directedness in their theory of the good is crucial, as metanorms are chiefly concerned with preserving the possibility of self-direction. But there are no more demanding metanorms that would require people to take an active role in promoting the flourishing of others.

The authors use the idea of rules in a game to draw a fine distinction between "guiding" conduct and "regulating" conduct to make the role of metanorms in human conduct clearer. A baseball player who follows all the rules of that game is playing correctly in some limited sense, but, from the fact that he allows his play to be regulated by the rules, it does not follow that he is playing well. But that is no shortcoming in the rules of baseball, because, like metanorms, they do nothing more than set the side constraints for the quality of play that actually makes one a good baseball player. It is no part of the rules of baseball to guide players as they take their swings. Now, among baseball fans, there are those who fetishize "playing the game the right way," praising as good players those they see as acting professionally despite, e.g., playing technically subpar defense. But of course, comments like those represent a blighted view of what makes a player good at baseball. From the perspective of the template of responsibility, many contemporary political philosophers are making an analogous mistake about the relationship between morality and politics. They think that the rules of a political order must naturally reflect and promote the correct account of human flourishing. But short of the limited role of metanorms in regulating, rather than guiding, conduct, politics is not an extension of ethics. In Den Uyl and Rasmussen's system, metanorms are the basis of a thin link between ethics and politics, since they think of liberalism as the political expression of metanorms protecting self-direction. "It is the profound recognition of the centrality of self-directedness to morality, and thus a recognition of the need to protect it, that gives rise to liberalism's championing of individual rights" (92).

Individualistic perfectionism, then, has an interesting relationship to politics. In Den Uyl and Rasmussen's terminology, their version of liberalism is "tethered' to their ethical views by metanorms. As I noted, theirs is an unusual version of political liberalism for being explicitly grounded in a perfectionist moral theory, but on their telling they are simply more open about that grounding than other political liberals. One lengthy chapter argues that Nussbaum, Rawls, and Sen all fail to unmoor liberalism from a comprehensive framework, as they merely smuggle in a template of respect. Another criticizes Gaus and Darwall for eliding the distinction between morality and politics, and so reducing morality to a system of rules for settling interpersonal conflict. In the place of these theories, proceeding from the template of respect, Den Uyl and Rasmussen recommend a turn to perfectionism.

In Part II, they defend their own version of the perfectionist turn. On their view, goodness "in its most general sense . . . is the conformity of a living thing to its nature" (222). Here the general approach is to show just how much theoretical mileage one can get out of starting with an "understanding that the natural order consists of things that have natures" (244). The nature of things within such an order consists of a thing's capacities, which are inherently normative -- they are meant to be realized. Den Uyl and Rasmussen argue that this hardcore teleological premise allows them to avoid all charges of committing a naturalistic fallacy. Our telos is fixed by the kind of thing that we are, and being a good instantiation of our life-form "involves activities that are in principle good for [us]." Or, as they put it variously, "there is no ontological separation between what is a good entity and what is good for that entity" (220).

The title of the final chapter -- "The Entrepreneur as Moral Hero" -- will, I suspect, likely be regarded as a bit much by all but those most friendly to the political views of the authors. But it would be a shame if less sympathetic readers disregarded it, as it is, in many ways, the best chapter of the book. Recall that Den Uyl and Rasmussen characterize the template of responsibility as proceeding from the thought that we must make something of our lives, and the association between entrepreneurship and ethics will be obvious. The entrepreneur, if successful, is one who makes the most of the opportunities and resources available to her in a market context where others are attempting to do the same. Such a person gains little useful information about how best to go about her business by asking what is required of her. She can do all that is required of her and realize none of her capacities, wasting every opportunity at her disposal. Abstracting from the particulars, this is the situation of all human beings. The case of the entrepreneur, then, is a nice sales pitch for the template of responsibility. It is understandable that such a person might be disappointed by the inapplicability of modern moral theories purporting to offer accounts of practical reason, which would suggest that we should also see the need for an alternative.

This book presents a novel and stimulating view of human flourishing that the authors put to interesting use in defending a non-perfectionist politics. There is a lot going on in its pages, but I had hoped for a little more clarification on the critical idea of a metanorm, which Den Uyl and Rasmussen have made use of across multiple works. In particular, I am not convinced that there should only be metanorms that generate negative rights. They write that liberal metanorms "constitute the basis for ethical principles that regulate conduct so as to establish conditions that secure and maintain the possibility of individuals pursuing their own forms of human flourishing and engaging in moral activity among others" (93, emphasis in original). But why should there be metanorms to secure and maintain the possibility of others' flourishing, but none that promote the same? If it is rational for me to support the security and maintenance of others' flourishing, what keeps me from taking a small step further into also supporting its promotion?

I suppose one answer might be that flourishing is, on Den Uyl and Rasmussen's view, simply "the deployment of practical wisdom" (323), and therefore there is little to be done to promote it in another. Flourishing requires nothing more than virtuous activity, so anything another person might do other than leave me alone is irrelevant. But this is an implausible view, particularly if we recognize great diversity in forms of human flourishing, as the authors do. Many people think that, for them, a good life involves making effective use of external goods. (Entrepreneurs seem to be a clear example.) Surely all those with preferences for such a life are not mistaken about what it means for them to flourish. If there are some whose flourishing requires external goods, then their flourishing could be effectively promoted externally. And if the flourishing of others can be promoted, we require an argument that metanorms calling for promotion of others' flourishing cannot be justified on the same grounds as the metanorms the authors favor.

The Perfectionist Turn covers an impressive amount of ground, from the metaethics of virtue to a mercifully non-Rawlsian basis for political liberalism. In developing a sophisticated normative system worthy of the name, Den Uyl and Rasmussen have shown ambition rarely seen in contemporary value theory. Their book is not an easy read, but it is a rewarding one.

[1] Douglas B. Rasmussen and Douglas J. Den Uyl, Norms of Liberty: A Perfectionist Basis for Non-Perfectionist Politics (Pennsylvania State University Press, 2005).