The Persistence of Subjectivity: On the Kantian Aftermath

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Robert B. Pippin, The Persistence of Subjectivity: On the Kantian Aftermath, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 380pp, $28.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521613043.

Reviewed by Richard Rorty, Stanford University


Robert Pippin is engaged in an ambitious project. He hopes to convince us that we have not yet gotten to the bottom of Hegel: we have neither appreciated his originality nor realized how much he can do for us. Not only is Hegel's work the hinge on which the history of modern philosophy turns, he is also the thinker who offers the most insight into the nature of modernity -- into the difference between the last few centuries of life in the West and life in other places and other times.

Like Terry Pinkard and Robert Brandom, Pippin wants us to stop thinking of Hegel as a metaphysician who believed in spooky immaterial causes, and to start thinking of him as the first thinker fully to appreciate the social character of knowledge -- the first to have realized that Descartes' individualism steered philosophy onto the wrong track. Had we listened to Hegel, Wittgenstein's private language argument would have seemed a reiteration of the obvious.

The outlines of Pippin's project first became clear in his third book (Modernism as a Philosophical Problem: On the Dissatisfactions of European High Culture (1991)). He pressed on with it in his fourth (Idealism as Modernism: Hegelian Variations (1997)), and in his fifth (Henry James and the Modern Moral Life (2000)). This sixth book consolidates earlier gains, and breaks fresh ground. Reading it confirms my impression that Pippin is one of the most original and imaginative philosophers now at work.

The fourteen essays that make up The Persistence of Subjectivity include discussions of (among other things) Heidegger's notion of "the truth of Being", Gadamer's relation to Hegel and to Heidegger, Adorno on the falseness of bourgeois life, Strauss on why ancient political philosophy was so much better than anything written after 1600, Arendt on the bourgeois origins of totalitarian evil, Manfred Frank on romantic subjectivity, John McDowell on "second nature", Martha Nussbaum's and Elaine Scarry's descriptions of how literature makes us morally better, Proust on failing to become who one is, and the relation of abstract art to bourgeois existence.

For Pippin, Kant is, first and foremost, the man who cleared the way for Hegel. By showing that appeals to intuition, either sensory or intellectual, avail us nothing, Kant "essentially destroyed the classic picture of the sensible-intelligible relation" (p. 297). Anticipating Davidson and Brandom, Kant insisted on "the autonomy of the normative domain, the claim that the only thing that bears on the sufficiency of a reason is another reason, never a mere state of affairs or cause on its own". (p. 115) Kant tried to make it impossible to think of knowledge as a matter of getting little replicas of the extra-mental into our minds.

That was the first step in breaking down the subject-object problematic which Kant had inherited from Descartes. On Pippin's account, Hegel took the next step by replacing the Cartesian distinction between thinking substance and extended substance with that between Spirit and Nature -- between behavior controlled by social norms and other behavior. Once that change was made, we were able to stop thinking of human freedom as a matter of making the atoms swerve. We could switch to thinking of it as a matter of making social norms explicit, thus putting ourselves in a position to resist them or change them. Hegel showed us how to think of increased self-consciousness as increased freedom. Had we listened to him, Harry Frankfurt's account of freedom in terms of second-order desires would have gone without saying.

Hegel tried to complete the revolution that Kant began by proposing that philosophy focus on changes in social norms, and thus become, as he put it, "its time held in thought". That amounts to asking philosophers to turn away from physical nature and toward human history -- to replace metaphysics and epistemology with social philosophy as the "core" of the discipline. In some countries -- those in which modernity is a principal topic of philosophical discussion -- this proposal has been taken seriously. But it still does not get much of a hearing in Anglophone countries.

The distinctive feature of Hegel's own time was the emergence of what Pippin, following Hegel, calls "a prosaic, unheroic world"(p. 295), the world of the modern bourgeoisie, the world we still inhabit. Nietzsche hated that world, and Pippin devotes about a third of this book to writers who thought that Nietzsche had a good point. He is willing to grant that Arendt, Adorno, Strauss (and maybe even Heidegger) were all "on to something" -- that they diagnosed some characteristic pathologies of bourgeois existence. But he does not really have much use for them. He has none at all for Hellenophile nostalgia (such as Heidegger's reverence for the pre-Socratics, Arendt's for the polis, and Strauss's for the days when we had real philosophers, not just intellectuals). Pippin thinks that it is time for philosophers to stop being snide about bourgeois democracy, and to think about celebrating it.

I do not have the space to discuss every piece in this volume, so I shall focus on those that strike me as the most exciting and imaginative. In them, Pippin explains how Hegel's account of progress as an increase in critical self-consciousness (rather than as a better grasp of something existing outside consciousness) is relevant not just to changes in social and political institutions but to developments in art and literature. Hegel's account fits, he says, "the modernist refusal to take for granted what a painting or art was, what writing or being an artist was". The insistent movement of Spirit toward greater self-consciousness -- described by Hegel in the Phenomenology -- produced not only bourgeois forms of civility and of political life but insured that "art making and novel writing would themselves become the subjects of art: Proust and James, de Kooning and Pollock being only the most obvious examples". (p. 298)

The two remarkable essays that conclude the volume expand on this claim. In "What was abstract art? (from the point of view of Hegel)" Pippin offers an explanation of what Hegel meant by "the end of art" that contrasts sharply with Arthur Danto's. Hegel's point, he argues, is not that the art vs. non-art distinction breaks down (in the way suggested by Duchamp's urinal) but rather that "art can no longer play the social role it did in Greece and Rome, in medieval and Renaissance Christianity, or in romantic aspirations for the role of art in liberation and Bildung … [T]here is no equivalently powerful role in bourgeois modernity". (p. 283)

Whereas Danto, in the tradition of Clement Greenberg, tells a story about abstract art that "is internal to art history itself", Pippin tells one that, although quite different from either, resembles T. J. Clark's and Michael Fried's. All three fold the history of painting into a larger narrative of social change. Pippin's story culminates in his claim that "representational art cannot adequately express the full subjectivity of experience, the wholly self-legislating, self-authorizing status of the norms that constitute such a subjectivity, or, thus, cannot adequately express who we (now) are". (p. 300)

In "On 'becoming who one is' (and failing): Proust's problematic selves", Pippin treats Proust's novel as showing how art that accepts, and works within, the disenchanted world of bourgeois freedom "does not re-enchant the world; it elevates us above the need for enchantment". (p. 289n.) That novel is not, he argues, a Bildungsroman, for at its end Marcel "has in effect implicitly had to give up the idea of some sort of internal teleology in his life." (p. 337) This means that the romantic and Nietzschean idea of "self-creation" is not apposite. Self-creation is a form of self-enchantment, and Proust, Pippin insists, offers us something better than that -- something more austere and more courageous. "If Marcel is to become who he is, it will not be in any such moment of stalled or stopped time". (p. 317)

Pippin asks us to give up the standard contrast between a "vain, social-climbing young Marcel" and a "wise, reflective narrator Marcel who writes the books we have just read". (p. 316) We should not praise Proust either for having created himself or for having achieved self-knowledge. Proust is the quintessentially modern novelist because he is the one who best appreciated the Hegelian point that there is nothing for the self to know about itself save its own enterprise of critical self-consciousness. That enterprise cannot conclude that it has reached its goal without betraying itself. Pippin makes us realize that, trite though it may be, "it's the journey that matters" would have made a good motto for both the Phenomenology and In Search of Lost Time.

A writer less learned and scrupulous might have offered this comparison between Hegel and Proust as a luminous apercu, without undertaking the struggle and labor of the negative -- without dealing with alternative interpretations. But that is not Pippin's style. Deploying an amazing range of reading, he pays careful and respectful attention to the views of other Hegel fans (such as McDowell) and other Proust freaks (such as Leo Bersani and Vincent Descombes). Each essay in this volume makes ample reference, and gives a fair shake, to those who hold quite different views. Most of them are bedecked with footnotes which are themselves compact little mini-essays. (See, for example, the brief but striking contrast between the Kantian sublime and the sublime of Calvin and Pascal at p. 294n.)

Everything Pippin writes is very densely argued, and demands slow and careful reading. But the rewards are great. I can think of no other philosopher writing today who is so consistently illuminating on such a wide range of topics. We can learn a lot from Pippin. He may well succeed in carrying out his project.