The Phenomenal Basis of Intentionality

The Phenomenal Basis Of Intentionality Book Cover

Angela Mendelovici, The Phenomenal Basis of Intentionality, Oxford University Press, 2018, 275pp., $78.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190863807.

Reviewed by Adam Pautz, Brown University


When you were born into the world, you began with a basic repertoire of sensory-perceptual experiences representing the world around you. On the basis of those experiences, you acquired beliefs and desires about things in your environment. Then you learned a language and became able to think about a great many things far outside of the "perceptual circle". What is the ground of all this intentionality?

In the 1980s and 1990s, many (e.g., Fodor, Millikan, Neander) developed the "reductive externalist program". Tracking relations (informational or teleological relations) between your brain and the world play a foundational role in pinning town original intentionality. More recently, others (e.g., Loar, Horgan and Tienson, Siewert) have developed an opposing "phenomenal intentionality" program. Your conscious experiences and their intentional contents are internally-determined and play a foundational role in pinning down the contents of your mental states. So a life-long "brain in the void" (BIV) that entirely lacks tracking relations to its environment might nevertheless share your experiences and many of your intentional states.

In her excellent book, Angela Mendelovici develops a sophisticated form of the phenomenal intentionality program. She holds that "all actual originally intentional states arise from phenomenal consciousness" (84), where "intentional state" is explained ostensively (chapter 1). Introspection shows that some original intentionality is grounded in this way and other considerations show that nothing else could do the trick (91-93). Indeed "all intentional states are phenomenal intentional states" (86).

Mendelovici's most important contribution is a detailed account of how experience grounds intentionality. To illustrate, I will focus on a hypothetical example involving Mendelovici's character "Lina" who shows up a couple of times in the book. Imagine that Lina has lived all her life all alone on an island and develops increasingly sophisticated intentional states.

We start with Mendelovici's account of Lina's sensory-perceptual experiences. Imagine that Lina has experience of a tomato -- a "prime" example of phenomenal intentionality (85, 101). Necessarily, anyone who has this experience represents the "phenomenal" content there is a red and round object. A tracking theory (Tye, Dretske) might claim that the red quality is a reflectance property of the tomato and that Lina phenomenally represents it by undergoing a neural state that has a history of tracking it. Against this view, Mendelovici develops a "mismatch argument" (chapter 3). Introspection suggests that the red quality represented by Lina's experience is a "simple" quality distinct from the reflectance property tracked by her visual system. Indeed, it is a simple quality the tomato doesn't actually possess; color experience is illusory. Lina's internal neural processing, rather than her tracking relations to the world, enables her to phenomenally represent this uninstantiated quality.

Mendelovici distinguishes between two ways of developing her internalist theory of experience. First, the relation view. In one version, Lina's experience consists in her "phenomenally representing" the content that something is red and round, understood as an abstract item distinct from herself. This is grounded in her internal physical state (200). Against this, Mendelovici objects that relations to abstract items cannot play the psychological and epistemic role we attribute to experiences (205-206). So, she instead opts for the aspect view: "to intentionally represent the content C is to have a state with a particular aspect, where this aspect is identical to C" (198). She applies the aspect view to all forms of intentionality.

Let us now imagine that Lina develops increasingly sophisticated intentional states going beyond her sensory-perceptual experiences. Like others, Mendelovici holds that Lina has "cognitive experiences" distinct from her sensory experiences (101, 126 fn.7) in which she "grasps" certain contents.

However, a very interesting feature of Mendelovici's view is that, against other proponents of cognitive experiences, she holds that the built-in phenomenal contents of Lina's cognitive experiences are very impoverished (101). She doesn't anywhere provide a complete and principled list, but she suggests that they involve the following:

approximate number (129)

identity (238)

truth and justification (149)

goodness and badness (89)

causation (147)

gisty and schematic notions (130)

the "cashing-out" relation (151)

The result is a "moderate" form of the phenomenal intentionality program. There is a foundational layer of phenomenal contents that are directly fixed by the phenomenal characters of Lina's sensory and cognitive experiences, which are in turn presumably fixed by her internal brain states. But this layer is limited to basic perceptible properties and matters on the short list above. Further, because they are shared between Lina and all her phenomenal duplicates (including her BIV-duplicates), they are limited to "narrow" contents.

However, Mendelovici recognizes that Lina can in some sense come to represent contents going beyond the basic phenomenal contents (see chapters 7-8; but see also 150, fn.36, and 220). For one thing, Lina might believe "wide" contents about particular objects and natural kinds in her environment. And if Lina is a genius and manages on her own to invent a sophisticated language, then she might eventually come to believe that 68 plus 57 equals 125, that the mental supervenes on the physical, that solitaire is a fun game, and so on. All these contents appear to go beyond the basic phenomenal contents on the above list. How does Mendelovici explain this?

Mendelovici's main proposal here is self-ascriptivism. To illustrate, suppose that Lina writes "68 plus 57 equals 125" in her notebook. Lina's cognitive experience might have the simple phenomenal content this is about number-like things, because of "ease and efficiency" (129-130). However, according to self-ascriptivism, Lina could have a "cashing-out" thought (or a series of such thoughts) to the effect that this cashes out to more elaborate mathematical content C+, where C+ is the mathematical content that we ordinarily take "68 plus 57 equals 125" to have.

This may seem to pass the buck. For what fixes the complex content that this cashes out to C+ of Lina's cashing-out thought? What makes it the case that it doesn't ascribe a bent, quus-like content? Mendelovici's answer is that Lina's cashing-out thought is itself a kind of "phenomenal experience" (151). It is the phenomenal character of her experience that determines that it has the content that this cashes out to C+. This phenomenal-intentional state is presumably grounded in Lina's brain state.

Mendelovici notes that this view implies that the content that this cashes out to C+ is itself a possible phenomenal content. That is why the cashing-out relation is on her list of possible phenomenal contents (151). Further, in this kind of case, the terminus of the cashing out process, C+, is a phenomenal content too. Given her moderate view, C+ must therefore be somehow specifiable in terms of a rather limited list of basic phenomenal contents (145, 151). Perhaps, if we add the notions number, zero, and successor to the basic list, then Lina could ultimately cash out "68 plus 57 equals 125" in these terms.

In the same way, Mendelovici holds that, when Lina thinks that the mental supervenes on the physical, or that knowledge is valuable, or that solitaire is a game, Lina could somehow ultimately cash out their contents in terms of a limited stock of basic phenomenal contents. In this way, "dispositions to have cashing-out thoughts allow us to effectively bootstrap our way out of the confines of our own consciousness, opening us up to a world of rich, complex, and sophisticated contents" (154).

Mendelovici also uses self-ascriptivism to explain how Lina can have standing beliefs and desires that in some sense have contents (e.g., wide, object-involving or kind-involving contents) going beyond the limited, "narrow" phenomenal contents of her states. The basic idea is that Lina is disposed to have cashing-out cognitive experiences that (directly or indirectly) ascribe such contents to her inner states or to herself (chapter 8). Mendelovici notes that "self-ascriptivism about personal standing states combines nicely with self-ascriptivism about the alleged contents of thoughts" (178).

Finally, Mendelovici proposes a matching account of truth and reference. On this matching theory, "a content is true (or refers) if it matches some other item in the world, which is its truth-maker (or referent)" (225). Recall that, on Mendelovici's general aspect view, contents are "aspects of intentional states". So the idea is that aspects of Lina's own internal intentional states somehow match items in the extra-mental world, which she explains in terms of the sharing of "superficial characters" (226).

Having explained the contours of Mendelovici's phenomenal intentionality theory, I now turn to questions. Let us start with Mendelovici's introspective "mismatch" argument against tracking theories. As Mendelovici acknowledges, one reply is that, as Lina views a tomato, the color quality red she phenomenally represents is in fact identical with the reflectance her visual system tracks, but this is not introspectively obvious (Byrne and Hilbert 2003: 793). In response, Mendelovici says that the non-obvious identity claim is poorly motivated (48, fn.23). I think this may be too strong. After all, it is plausible that the apparent round shape of the tomato is a real property of the tomato and that Lina phenomenally represents it by tracking it -- as Mendelovici herself concedes (38). In general, the tracking view is initially plausible for the representation of "primary qualities". If so, the simplest and most uniform hypothesis may be that the apparent red color quality is also a real property of the tomato (a reflectance) and that Lina phenomenally represents it by tracking it. In the end, I agree with Mendelovici that the tracking theory fails, but I think we may need other, more empirical arguments to defeat it.

Consider next Mendelovici's aspect view of sensory-perceptual intentionality. She argues for it on the grounds that considerations about the psychological-epistemic role of experience rule out the alternative "relation view" on which Lina's tomato-like experience consists in her phenomenally representing the content something is reddish and round, understood as a distinct abstract item. But there are possible responses. Maybe Lina's phenomenally representing this abstract content plays a psychological-explanatory role because it supervenes on computational processing that plays such a role. And maybe it's just in its nature to provide her with an epistemic reason to believe the content (as "dogmatists" maintain). And even if we ultimately reject the relational view, we needn't jump to Mendelovici's aspect view. For there is an alternative that Mendelovici doesn't consider. We might explain experience in terms of "phenomenally representing that so-and-so" (where this is internally-determined), but then say that this sentential operator is basic and is not to be further analyzed in terms of being mentally related to a proposition, a possible state-of-affairs, a property-complex, or anything else (Prior 1971: chapter 2). The result would be a non-relational, nominalist-friendly form of "intentionalism" about experience. This differs from Mendelovici's aspect view. It avoids the claim that "what Lina's experience says" (5), that is, the content of her experience (viz., that there is a red and round thing), is somehow "an aspect of" her own experience (198).

Turning to Mendelovici's self-ascriptivism, one issue is that it may be overly sophisticated. Let us imagine Lina alone on her island when she was a child without language. She has beliefs and desires with wide contents about objects and kinds in her environment that go beyond the contents of her sensory-perceptual experiences (although there are limits to pre-linguistic content). And those beliefs and desires have more-or-less determinate truth-conditions. But, contrary to Mendelovici's self-ascriptivism for standing states (178), Lina the child will have not, or at least need not have, dispositions to have sophisticated cashing-out thoughts ("self-ascriptions") to the effect that this cashes out to that. Intuitively, in order to have such beliefs and desires, it is enough that she merely have certain sensory-perceptual experiences and rich dispositions to act. Mendelovici briefly asserts that animals and children might have cashing-out thoughts because they are "undemanding" (151, n.38), but I wonder if there is any evidence that they have such thoughts.

Mendelovici also applies self-ascriptivism to Lina's more sophisticated thoughts after she has invented a language. One question here is whether her view accommodates the holism of thought -- something she does not address. As discussed above, she holds that Lina's mathematical thoughts are constituted by her actual and potential experiences. For instance, Lina can in principle have a cognitive experience with the complex "phenomenal content" C+ which cashes out the content of "68 plus 57 equals 125" (151). Now atomism is right for sensory-perceptual experiences: a BIV could come into existence, have a single color experience for 20 seconds, and then go out of existence. Is atomism then also right for cognitive experiences? Could a 20-second BIV have as its only mental state an isolated cognitive experience with a complex mathematical content C+, without having a person-level language and without ever having had sensory-perceptual experiences of a number of things (or even the capacity for such experiences)? That would imply that a single mathematical thought could constitute an entire mental life. But without the capacity to experience a number of things, how could such a 20-second BIV have a concept of number?

Another question for Mendelovici's account of thought concerns the role of language. Our pre-linguistic ancestors had an "approximate number system" but were unable to have thoughts about large exact numbers. Many have suggested that it is language that enables us to have such thoughts. In fact, without language, it's metaphysically impossible for a human being to have advanced mathematical thoughts (e.g., Fermat's Last Theorem). In general, human prelinguistic thought is necessarily limited; language is needed to take us beyond those limits. But language appears to play no essential role in Mendelovici's account. For instance, in principle, why couldn't Lina come to have a cognitive experience with the phenomenal content C+ (a complex mathematical content) without first inventing language?

Finally, a comment on Mendelovici's matching account of truth and reference. Lina can in principle have thought-experiences with phenomenal contents C+, D+, and so on, that cash out "68 plus 57 equals 125", "the mental supervenes on the physical", and so on. According to her aspect view, these contents are somehow aspects of her own experiences. (Indeed, she says that, in one version, they are "aspects of [her] neural states" (199).) However, after reading her discussion I was still unsure how aspects of Lina's own experiences might "match" external facts: the fact that 68 plus 57 equals 125, or the fact that mental supervenes on the physical, and so on.

Although I have raised some questions about the details, I found the basic elements of Mendelovici's "consciousness first" account to be very convincing. The phenomenal contents of our conscious experiences are very thin. They are internally-determined, rather than being determined by tracking relations to the environment. And they play a crucial role in determining the contents of our other intentional states. In an era of increasingly specialization and "small ball" philosophy, Mendelovici's stimulating book takes on a foundational issue in the philosophy of mind, developing a novel strategy for solving "the hard problem of intentionality". It is one of the first to develop the phenomenal intentionality program in detail and should become a starting point for future discussions of this topic.


Byrne, A. and D. Hilbert. (2003). Color realism revisited. Behavioral and Brain Sciences, 26, 791-793.

Prior, A. N. (1971). Objects of Thought. Oxford: Clarendon Press.