The Phenomenal Self

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Barry Dainton, The Phenomenal Self, Oxford University Press, 2008, 434pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199288847.

Reviewed by William Uzgalis, Oregon State University


The Phenomenal Self by Barry Dainton is a sustained effort to give a neo-dualist account of the self in terms of a neo-Lockean account of personal identity. The author is thus attempting to merge two previously distinct areas in the Philosophy of Mind -- the debate between physicalists and neo-dualists over the status of consciousness and debates about the nature of personal identity. I think that the word "phenomenal" for Dainton simply means experience and the book treats many of the topics that traditional theories of "Phenomenology" such as those of Husserl or Merleau-Ponty explore. He allows that experience does not have to be true (and, presumably, neither do our theories about experience), and thus his use of "phenomenal" is at least compatible with Daniel Dennett's account of experience -- though I think it is clear that he would not accept the conclusions that Dennett draws from his heterophenomenological investigations in Consciousness Explained and subsequent works.

Dainton pursues two goals through thirteen chapters. The first is to give a general, metaphysical account of the self and the second is to pursue a neo-Lockean strategy of showing how the self can persist through most (if not all) of the transformations we can imagine ourselves undergoing. The self is conceived in mentalistic terms. Dainton's neo-Lockeanism differs in striking ways from what he calls the orthodox version. Locke distinguished souls, bodies, and consciousness, and made consciousness the bearer of personal identity, an identity that could persist through changes in either mental or bodily substances. Dainton's form of neo-Lockeanism is one that focuses on phenomenal continuity, "the sort of continuity we find in our streams of consciousness from moment to moment" (xiii). It pushes the effort to isolate what the self and its persistence conditions are pretty much to the limit, or perhaps beyond, by claiming that even psychological continuity can be eliminated in favor of phenomenal continuity. The distinction between these two sorts of continuity is an expression of Dainton's neo-dualism (xiv).

In Chapter 1 Dainton offers thought experiments for two conclusions. The first of these is that animalism is untenable. Animalism is the position that a person just is a certain sort of animal. Imagine each of your cells being replaced by a similarly sized non-biological device that functions in the same way as the cell it replaces, and that you remain conscious in the course of the procedure. Under these circumstances, Dainton claims, you would survive the procedure but you would no longer be an animal -- a human being (pp. 2-3). The second thought experiment goes to show that the traditional neo-Lockean emphasis on psychological continuity is also an inadequate account of the persistence of persons. Dainton uses a modern version of the Reduplication Argument first used by Samuel Clarke at the beginning of the 18th century to raise doubts about psychological continuity theories. He imagines that having made a complete cellular map of your body we acquire the ability to build exact physical replicas of you. These replicas are conscious and psychologically indistinguishable from you. He claims on the basis of this thought experiment that there is a distinction between psychological continuity and phenomenal or experiential continuity and that this latter form of continuity is better suited to explaining the persistence of persons and for carrying out the neo-Lockean project.

In Chapters 2 and 3 Dainton tries to "achieve a reasonably clear and accurate picture of the synchronic and diachronic unity to be found in typical streams of consciousness, and establish that these unities are a result of phenomenal relationships" (xix). Having established these results allows Dainton to "account for the unity of consciousness at a time and over time without appealing to the causal relationships that are constitutive of psychological continuity" (xix). A second result is "that we can account for the unity of consciousness without invoking the self." This also provides a non-question begging criterion for assigning experiences to subjects. Experiences "can have a common owner without being co-conscious, but there is little doubt that experiences that are in fact co-conscious are also co-subjective" (xx). The basic intuition about diachronic persistence is that a stream of consciousness, as long as it is uninterrupted, is an identical self. But, of course, steams of consciousness are regularly interrupted as in sleep, and we do not think of ourselves as a new person when we awake in the morning, so Dainton concludes that the self is not, after all, just an uninterrupted stream of consciousness.

Having reached this point in his project, Dainton now claims that he has enough to explain "the conditions under which a subject of experience can continue to exist through periods of unconsciousness" (xx). "What," Dainton asks, "is a subject of experience if not a being that has the capacity to have experiences? How are capacities for experience related to the same subject at any given time? An obvious and compelling answer: they can contribute to unified streams of consciousness" (xx). Chapter 4 is taken up with developing this basic picture, and the result is what Dainton calls "the C theory." So, it turns out, the self is a set of capacities for experience. He distinguishes two forms of it. "In its narrow (less ambitious guise) it offers no more than an account of our persistence conditions; in its broader (more ambitious) guise it provides an account of what we are" (xx). In Chapter 5 Dainton deals with three competing accounts of experience based conceptions of the self -- those of John Foster, Galen Strawson and Peter Unger -- and argues that the C-theory is superior to its competitors in explaining how the self persists through interruptions in consciousness.

Chapter 6 is devoted to the comparison of the phenomenal and the non-phenomenal parts of the mind or the C-theory and the psychological continuity approach. Once again it becomes plain that we have a neo-dualist conception of the mind being applied to issues about personal identity. Psychological continuity, on Dainton's account, is the diachronic expression of functionalism. His claim is that there is a distinction between psychological continuity and experiential continuity and that the latter does a better job of grasping the nature of the self over time. This is Dainton's extension of neo-dualism (as opposed to functionalism) into the realm of personal identity. Consciousness is more important than function. Dainton goes on to argue that where these two kinds of continuities diverge, "all our deepest identity related concerns remain locked onto the experiential continuities" (xxi). Chapter 7 deals with issues related to embodiment. "What is the relation between an embodied human subject and the human animal which sustains such a subject's mental capacities?"

In Chapter 8 Dainton begins by considering how little a subject can possess by way of experiential capacities and still exist. The answer is very little indeed. Along the way he argues for the possibility of a form of consciousness that is not self-conscious or reflexive. The aim here is to show that there may well be selves that are conscious but have no psychological system with "anything approaching the complexity required for rudimentary reasoning and the forming of intentions" (p. 248). He then goes on to consider whether "a subject's experience is necessarily the product of experiential capacities" (xxi). Again he offers a thought experiment to show that there can be experience without experiential capacities. He ends Chapter 8 by considering whether a partially unified consciousness is possible. He argues that if the answer is "no" then "there is a sense in which selves are necessarily simpler than they would be if the answer were "yes" (xxii) and opts for the "no" answer. Chapter 9 continues the exploration of the simplicity of the phenomenal self by exploring interdependencies in systems of experiential capacities. He claims: "The interdependencies are sufficiently deep and pervasive that the relevant systems of capacities (and hence our selves) are composed of parts that are inseparable from their wholes" (xxii). In Chapter 10 Dainton turns to the question of whether subject identity is absolute or not -- whether it has sharp temporal boundaries. He argues that the answer is not clear-cut. He explores a second and even more difficult question as to whether "the kind of potential for experience our brains possess is all-or-nothing." He argues that we can take it to be so, but not without difficulties (xxii). In Chapter 11, having explored what the C-theory is in some detail, Dainton turns to replying to objections. In Chapter 12 he deals with fission and fusion cases that represent a serious challenge to his view, among other subjects. And the final chapter is an "Appendix" on "Reductionism."

Dainton is hard working. He knows the literature on a variety of the subjects covered in the book and threads his way through it with dexterity. He tries to stay neutral on a variety of metaphysical issues so that his theory may flourish whatever the outcome of those debates. I found his resolution of fission and fusion cases by analogy with time travel cases quite interesting. Still, Dainton's attempt to merge neo-dualism with a neo-Lockean account of personal identity faces some serious difficulties.

Dainton claims in Chapter 1 that his new theory is superior to other versions of neo-Lockeanism because his account of the persistence of the self is more intuitive than the psychological continuity criteria of traditional neo-Lockeanism. But what we are presented with in Chapter 1 changes. Streams of consciousness are replaced by capacities for contributing to the same stream of consciousness, and at this point Dainton has the problem of how to identify streams of consciousness across gaps. Dainton writes:

if one's experiential capacities are wholly unchanged -- in the sense that the range of potential experiences available to one remains the same, even if the substrate of these capacities change -- it seems clear that one survives the process, even if one's brain has been turned into a lump of silicates. This suggests that retaining the capacity for consciousness is sufficient for our survival. (p. 79)

Dainton is quite explicit that causal connections across gaps are out. In Chapter 6 he makes this the defining difference between the two theories (p. 179). But rather plainly Dainton's criterion has serious problems. First, there is no reason to think that "the range of potential experiences available to one" stays the same across gaps in consciousness. Or perhaps the range of potential experiences stays the same, but it might increase or decrease in either determinables or determinates. Second, arguably many humans have the same range of potential experiences. Without invoking the kind of causal connections that Dainton wants to ban in support of neo-dualism, it seems hard to see how one could use this criterion to decide that one stream of consciousness among many is the proper continuer across gaps when the range of potential experiences is the same. Finally, the criterion is open to just the kind of Reduplication Argument that Dainton deploys against psychological continuity theories. Samuel Clarke claimed his version of the Reduplication Argument applied to all theories of personal identity that treat persons as collections of qualities instead of substances. Dainton's theory treats persons as a collection of qualities just as much as psychological continuity theories do. There certainly are puzzles connected with Reduplication Arguments, but as far as I can see Dainton's criterion is so weak that there is no need to invoke such arguments to dismiss it. Thus, the orthodox neo-Lockean psychological continuity criteria for determining the persistence of persons across gaps in consciousness that do not distinguish between the phenomenal and the functional are to be preferred to Dainton's criterion.

There is a second problem. What Dainton means by "psychological continuity" is radically different from what "orthodox" neo-Lockeans mean. The most obvious expression of this difference is that orthodox neo-Lockeans include experiential or event memory in their account of psychological continuity (after all, event memory was a fundamental element in Locke's original account of personal identity and he was the one who made consciousness the bearer of personal identity for the first time), while after Chapter 1 Dainton does not. By Chapter 6, where he takes up the contrast, Dainton has transferred experiential memory to the phenomenal side of the divide leaving his version of "psychological continuity" without it. There is, presumably, some sort of memory on the psychological continuity side, one that has all the causal connections usually associated with memory, just not the experiences of remembering. This is, one may suppose, zombie memory. The effort to divorce event memory from its causes is doomed to failure -- since the divorce allows for the introduction of false event memories (by hypnosis, etc.) that cannot be discriminated without invoking causality. Thus, the claim that his version of neo-Lockeanism is better than its competitors involves an equivocation on the term 'psychological continuity,' and the Chapter 6 account separates the elements of event memory in a way that destroys the coherence of the concept, while the orthodox neo-Lockean analysis does not.

Orthodox neo-Lockeans include the phenomenal as part of psychological continuity. So, they get many of the advantages Dainton attributes to experience, and they do not divorce experience from function in the way that Dainton's neo-dualism forces him to do. And Dainton admits that such a divorce between the phenomenal and the psychological may not be possible. I am fairly convinced that it is not possible. If this is the case, it would appear that orthodox neo-Lockeanism is superior to Dainton's account of the persistence of persons on this score as well.

Dainton's account of the self as a stream of consciousness is strikingly limited in a number of respects. In discussing Locke's account of the self at the beginning of the book, Dainton sets aside significant parts of the Lockean conception of consciousness and the self. In particular he sets aside the action initiating and appropriating parts of the self. The Lockean notion that being conscious entails the pursuit of happiness is missing. We get a notion of a self as something having the capacity for experience and perhaps as something having experiences but not as an actor or as having motives for action. This means, for example, that consciousness is not connected with the struggle for survival in any fundamental way. Nor is this accidental. It is a result of the distinction between phenomenal and non-phenomenal aspects of the self, between qualia and function that we have already observed. Action and its motivations are all assigned to the non-phenomenal or the causal/functional parts of the self and the phenomenal is privileged (see p. 190).

For the reasons just given I am quite skeptical of the possibilities for success of Dainton's main project in the book -- that of giving a neo-dualist, neo-Lockean account of the self and its persistence. Nonetheless, for anyone interested in these issues the book is rich, interesting and full of provocative ideas.