The Phenomenological Approach to Social Reality: History, Concepts, Problems

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Alessandro Salice and Hans Bernhard Schmid (eds.), The Phenomenological Approach to Social Reality: History, Concepts, Problems, Springer, 2016, 379pp., $129.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783319276915.

Reviewed by Andrea Staiti, Boston College


Alessandro Salice and Hans Bernhard Schmid's volume offers a remarkably cohesive and informative array of essays engaging the views of various phenomenologists on the multifaceted issue of sociality. As the editors explain, this collection is intended to dispel a lurking skepticism among philosophers about "the suitability of phenomenology as an approach to the nature, structure, and perhaps essence of social reality" (1). Such skepticism is motivated by phenomenology's alleged "solipsistic position" (2), and its ensuing inability to describe the social world on its own terms; however, the emergence of debates about the nature of collective intentionality and shared experiences in recent analytic philosophy (at least in the wake of Searle's extensive work on the subject) has sparked new interest in the earlier work of phenomenologists, which turns out to be a "surprisingly rich quarry of insights" (2) directly pertaining to issues in contemporary philosophy of sociality.

The volume is clearly organized in three parts. "Social Institutions and Facts" (17-144) deals with issues in legal philosophy and the relationship between individuals (both acts and persons) and social entities. "Doing Things Together" (145-234) focuses on the phenomenon of collective intentionality and related puzzles about the 'carrier' of collective intentions, as well as the distinctions between different modes of acting together. I "The Values and Ontological Status of Social Reality" (237-379) tackles issues in value-theory that have a direct bearing on the constitution and ontological status of human communities.

Since I cannot even begin to do justice to the richness of each chapter in the limited space of a review, I will instead group the chapters together in three categories and comment on each category. Considering that all chapters deal explicitly with one or more figures from the phenomenological tradition, it seems appropriate in the present context to divide them up by reference to the thinkers under scrutiny and according to their level of 'popularity' among students and scholars of phenomenology. We find essays on (i) leading figures in phenomenology (Husserl, Heidegger, and Scheler), (ii) lesser-known figures (Adolf Reinach, Gerda Walther, Alfred Schutz, Karl Löwith, Dietrich von Hildebrand, Roman Ingarden, Wilhelm Schapp, and Felix Kaufmann) and (iii) virtually unknown figures (Czesław Znamierowski, Hermann Schmalenbach, and Tomoo Otaka). Accordingly, my question in what follows will be: what and how much does this volume teach us about leading, lesser known, and virtually unknown phenomenologists, respectively, with regard to their treatment of social reality? The short answer to this question is: a lot. This volume should be mandatory reading for all those who believe that they already know the phenomenological tradition inside out, and for all those who believe that when it comes to the actual philosophical issues the phenomenological tradition is of merely historical interest. Members of both groups would be positively surprised about how much there still is to discover about phenomenology and how remarkably pertinent these discoveries are to current debates in philosophy. But let me proceed in order. I will devote a bit more space to the leading phenomenologists, presuming that readers will be most interested in hearing about them, but I will also try to acknowledge the richness of lesser-known and virtually unknown figures.

Thomas Szanto's "Husserl on Collective Intentionality" (145-172) explores the work of the founding father of the phenomenological movement in great detail to find traces of a theory of collective intentionality. Szanto draws on an impressive array of primary sources (including volumes of Husserliana that were published just recently and have not received much attention yet) to show that in addition to his theory of empathy and intersubjectivity, Husserl also developed an embryonic theory of collective intentionality. Not only can Husserl be credited with coining the phrase "social ontology", whose first occurrence is to be found in a research manuscript from 1910 (146fn.); in addition, Szanto distinguishes as many as five stages (or perhaps just four: the list on page 149 is slightly confusing) in Husserl's analysis of the "process of socialization", ranging from the elementary act of empathy (i.e., recognizing an animate body as such and ascribing subjectivity to it), through various types of communicative acts, and all the way up to collective intentionality proper. In Szanto's painstaking analysis, Husserl can be viewed as endorsing both a "formal" and a "subjective anti-individualism" (160). Formal anti-individualism means that there exist forms of intentionality having "a first-person plural form or mode" (160). Subjective anti-individualism means that we-intentions "have a supra-individual subject of intention" (160), which is to say that collective intentionality cannot be reduced to a kind of interlocking of individual intentions.

In the rest of the chapter Szanto does a good job of fending off potential criticism, arguing that, thanks to Husserl's phenomenological theory of founded objects, supra-individual subjects of intentions are not to be understood as metaphysical entities ontologically on par with individual subjects (163 f.). Higher-order persons are "functional and intentional poles of actions, thoughts, intentions, or values" (164). Szanto's analysis is carefully argued and he offers plenty of textual evidence for his interpretation. However, his insistence on the "multi-dimensional model of the respective subjects" of collective intentionality (166) leaves unanswered the question of what exactly happens at the ontological level when a merely "multipolar" or "many-headed" group of subjects merges "so as to become unitary" (164), thereby becoming "analogous to the ego-centered individuals" (164).

In order to answer this question properly, one would need to delve into the specifics of Husserl's theory of personhood. In what sense can a person be both individual and supra-individual, such that a multiplicity of individuals forming a unitary group do not undergo an ontological transformation, but simply instantiate at the collective level the same essence that they already instantiated at the individual level, namely, 'person'? One should note here that already at the individual level Husserl does not identify 'person' with the whole human being, and not even with the totality of an individual's mental life. 'Person' is a rather a certain unitary stratum within a mental life, namely, the stratum comprising enduring habitualities and convictions that have been originally acquired through acts of 'position-taking' [Stellungnahmen]. Thus, to call groups 'higher-order persons' is not to say that there is such thing as a higher-order consciousness spanning individual consciousnesses, because 'person' and 'consciousness' already mean two different layers at the individual level. For Husserl, if X is capable of having habitualities and convictions originally acquired through position-takings and enduring in time, then X is a person. Groups are evidently capable of having habitualities and convictions of this kind, therefore groups are persons. To avoid conflations, it would be advisable to stick to Husserl's terminology and talk about higher-order persons, rather than collective subjects of intention. 'Subject' could be mistaken to mean 'consciousness', rather than 'person', thus misattributing to Husserl a theory of supra-individual consciousness, which he clearly does not endorse. For the most part, contemporary philosophers do not seem to appreciate the subtle phenomenological distinctions that can be drawn between 'subject', 'consciousness', 'person', 'human being', etc. Thus, at the end of the day it might turn out that Husserl has no straightforward answers to questions that are posed in the way contemporary philosophy does. The force of his phenomenology is rather to suspend the naïve pursuit of answers to questions that we do not fully understand in their very formulation.

The second leading phenomenologist discussed in the volume is Martin Heidegger. Jo-Jo Koo discusses the early Heidegger's views of sociality and situates them in the context of the"non-summative constructionism" (95) that characterizes much contemporary philosophy of sociality.  This isthe view that collective intentionality is not reducible to the intentions of the individuals involved, and yet emerges out of some kind of interlocking among them. However, Koo is very much aware of important differences between Heidegger and contemporary theorists. He nicely summarizes Heidegger's distinctive contribution in the following terms: "Whereas analytic social ontologists are primarily concerned with the process or mechanism by means of which interacting individuals can construct social or collective entities (collective beliefs, intentions, actions, agents, institutions, etc.), early Heidegger's crucial move emphasizes the conditions under which all entities, including social and collective ones, can make sense at all" (94). Koo's analysis emphasizes the role played by Heidegger's famous notion of the anyone (das Man), as the condition that enables individuals to have a referential nexus of practical possibilities that are governed by a set of publicly shared norms (105).

A particularly interesting aspect of Koo's chapter is his defense of an "evaluatively neutral interpretation of the significance of the anyone" (106), in contrast to a well-established interpretative trend that identifies the anyone with the condition of Uneigentlichkeit or un-ownedness of Dasein, a condition to which a negative connotation attaches. Between the opposite poles of ownedness and un-ownedness, Koo argues, there is a third mode of existence, that of Indifferenz or undistinguishedness (109). Undistinguishedness characterizes the anyone as the necessary point of departure of every Dasein, thus dispelling, in Koo's view, the received picture of Heidegger as scorning social existence tout court. This leads Koo to argue: "Early Heidegger's conception of human social existence and reality certainly makes room, then, for an evaluatively neutral (in his vocabulary, 'undistinguished') and thereby potentially positive account of human sociality and social reality" (112). The proposal is intriguing but I find the claim in this passage problematic. Is Heidegger's anyone evaluatively neutral in the strong sense, or is it merely evaluatively unsettled? Koo's argument seems to support the first option, given that the function of the anyone (making a shared world of possibilities of action possible in the first place) is taken to precede any consideration of Dasein's ownedness or un-ownedness. But if this is the case, then the anyone should be interpreted as evaluatively neutral, full stop, rather than evaluatively neutral and thereby potentially positive. Koo is right that the anyone does not necessarily have a negative connotation in Being and Time, at least as far as its significance at the initial stage of the analysis is concerned. But interpreting this neutrality as a resource to articulate a positive interpretation of social existence within the framework of Heidegger's existential analytics arguably goes a bit too far.

In one of the strongest showings in this volume, Matthias Schloßberger discusses "The Varieties of Togetherness: Scheler on Collective Affective Intentionality" (173-195). His central claim is that Scheler's theory of sympathy provides the resources to examine "all basic forms of human social existence" and to relate them to one another (175). Schloßberger wants to emphasize the differences between Scheler's and Husserl's theories of intersubjectivity, ultimately arguing that Husserl's intentionality-based theory of empathy rests on problematic Cartesian premises that Scheler sets out to overthrow. "For Scheler, 'sympathy' refers to an ultimately inexplicable relation between things -- in this case between living beings, and more specifically, between human beings" (177). In human interaction, "different forms of sympathy are accompanied by different forms of feelings" (178). Schloßberger lists three such forms: unification, sensing, and fellow feeling. Unification often happens at the unconscious level and without implying a genuine encounter with the other, as is the case with emotional contagion or imitation of another's gestures. Sensing, i.e. "understanding the other's feelings" (180), is a kind of immediate awareness of the other's feeling based on her expressive gestures that cannot be construed as an interpretation by analogy based on the experience of the other's body. Fellow feeling, by contrast, is the general concept for a variety of different sympathetic experiences. Schloßberger painstakingly analyzes two varieties, which he calls "feeling-with-one-another" and "fellow feeling-with another's feelings" (181). In the latter variety, the other's feeling is an object for me (I feel sorry for your loss), but in the former the feeling is immediately shared by two or more subjects and is directed to a common target, without becoming thematic as such (as in Scheler's famous example: two parents mourning for the loss of their child). Such phenomena are at the origin of the supra-individual subjective unit, which Scheler calls the Gesamtperson, or "collective person" (193).

Schloßberger unearths a tension in Scheler's writings. He seems to oscillate between the view that sensing, as defined above, has a foundational priority vis-à-vis fellow feeling, and the view that fellow feeling is fundamental (193). Be that as it may, Schloßberger makes it clear that Scheler does not believe in the existence of some kind of supra-individual collective soul[1], but he does argue that "a finite individual person can only realize himself on condition that he belongs to a collective person" (194). Considering Schloßberger's impressive command of Scheler's difficult texts and his argument about the important difference between Scheler and other phenomenologists, such as Husserl, it would have been interesting to read some discussion of the passages that other scholars of phenomenology, such as Zahavi, usually invoke to argue in favor of a substantial agreement. Schloßberger acknowledges Zahavi's interpretation in a footnote (176, fn.1), but does not directly engage with his alternative reading. This remark is not meant to indicate a flaw in this excellent chapter, just to express this reviewer's interest in learning more about Schloßberger's take on this important matter.

Most of the essays in this volume discuss the work of lesser-known phenomenologists, whose writings are not available in English translation and, in some cases, whose views on sociality are presented here for the first time. Pride of place here goes to Adolf Reinach, whose phenomenological theory of law is variously explored by Kevin Mulligan (17-45), Sophie Loidolt (47-73), and Francesca de Vecchi (279-316). Reinach holds that legal obligations are brought into being by the act of promising, which is the a priori foundation of law (39; 49). In this connection, he develops a theory of declarations or enactments (Bestimmungen) (22) that has remarkable affinities with John Searle's speech-acts, as Mulligan argues extensively. Loidolt and de Vecchi both write comparative essays in which Reinach's theory of law is contrasted with the "Vienna School of Jurisprudence" (48) and Wilhelm Schapp's A New Science of the Law (280), respectively.

De Vecchi admirably reconstructs the views of Wilhelm Schapp, according to whom "values are necessary in order for law to exist: there is no law if there are no values" (283).  But she ultimately argues that he fails to distinguish consistently between values and goods (287), and that values should be regarded at most as a "motivation for the existence of the law" (286), rather than its a priori foundation. De Vecchi considers Reinach's account superior, since "the a priori of the law Reinach presents are, very plainly, genuine a priori" (311), presumably because he does not invoke extra-legal entities such as values in his account. The only two weaknesses of this otherwise informative essay are the several stylistic and grammatical imprecisions in the English prose, and the imbalance between the section on Schapp (over twenty-five pages) and the section on Reinach (six pages). Given that de Vecchi finds Reinach more convincing, one would have expected her to spend more time detailing the strengths in Reinach's theory.

Loidolt's chapter presents a more balanced account of Reinach's views in contrast to Felix Kaufmann and Fritz Schreier. Interestingly, Schreier's and Kaufmann's charge against Reinach comes very close to de Vecchi's charge against Schapp in favor of Reinach, namely, that he unduly introduced extra-legal elements in what should be a pure theory of law. In Kaufmann's criticism, Reinach still remains within the scope of a "theory of command" (57) and fails to consider the content of a legal enactment in its own right and independently of the "specific addressee" (57) of the enactment. Similarly, contra Reinach, for Schreier "Pure theory of law . . . limits itself exclusively to the 'imputation of legal effects to legal presuppositions'" (65). Loidolt, however, proposes an ingenious solution to reconcile the two conceptions of a phenomenology of law: "While Reinach's theory would provide the material meaning-conditions, i.e. the dimension of social interaction necessary for legal reality, Kaufmann's and Schreier's theories would, in a more specific area, provide the formal conditions that are necessary for a specifically legal structure" (67).

A less irenic perspective on Kaufmann and phenomenology characterizes Sonja Rinofner-Kreidl's fine essay "Disenchanting the Fact/Value Dichotomy: A Critique of Felix Kaufmann's Views on Value and Social Reality" (317-348). Briefly put, in keeping with the tenets of logical positivism, for Kaufmann "we cannot refer to value objects (i.e. to values as objects) that are said to belong to an independent sphere of reality.  . . . we should instead confine ourselves to analyzing value statements", and in particular "to inquiring into means-ends relations and the relating dependent values" (323). Rinofner-Kreidl laments a "remarkable neglect of everyday evaluative experiences in Kaufmann's treatment of value issues" (329). She then presents Husserl's phenomenological treatment of values as a better alternative, which creates the conditions for a sufficiently objective description of values as the correlates of our evaluative experiences, without therefore endorsing a problematic metaphysical Platonism about values (337).

Salice and Edward M. Świderski tackle the issue of values in the phenomenological philosophies of Dietrich von Hildebrand and Roman Ingarden, respectively. Salice focuses on Hildebrand's analysis of "the unifying virtue or force that values can exert over individuals and that might bring them to constitute a community" (240). Particularly illuminating is Hildebrand's distinction between I-Thou and we-communities (241). The latter are "real wholes" (246) and "quasi-substantial" (254), although they do not require actual acquaintance among their members, such as, in Salice's example, a group of scientists working to cure a certain disease, who, in Hildebrand's view, already form a value-based we-community. As for Ingarden, Świderski admits that he did not really contribute directly to social ontology (259), but that a number of insights from his aesthetic theory and his later writings on responsibility and cultural objects could have a direct bearing on social philosophy, too.

To conclude this section on the lesser-known figures let me just mention briefly two chapters that I found somewhat less engaging by comparison to the ones discussed so far. Gerhard Thonhauser's chapter on "Karl Löwith's Understanding of Sociality" (121-141) focuses on Löwith's Habilitationsschrift, written under Heidegger, The Individual in the Role of the Fellow Human Being. Löwith's book is largely a critique of Heidegger revolving around the notion that fundamental ontology is politically suspicious because of its essentialism (134), and that the largely solipsistic framework of Being and Time downplays the value of human interaction (126). Part of the problem with this chapter is that Thonhauser himself does not seem to think highly of Löwith's criticism of Heidegger (125), nor does he find Löwith's account of sociality particularly strong (137-140). Despite Thonhauser's attempt to highlight some positive aspects at the end of the chapter (140), I didn't find his reconstruction of Löwith's analysis very compelling. The same goes for the short chapter on Alfred Schutz and Gerda Walther by Felipe León and Dan Zahavi (219-234). Besides failing to explain why the two are here together and whether there were actual historical interactions between them, the chapter moves rather quickly on the specifics of both Schutz and Walther and ends with a puzzling diagram that is meant to illustrate Walther's arguably rather obscure theory of empathy (230).

We turn, finally, to some virtually unknown phenomenologists. Giuseppe Lorini and Wojciech Żełaniec. provide the first ever study in English of Polish philosopher Czesław Znamierowski's social ontology. The chapter is very short, but it offers a vivid picture of an intellectual who received his education from some of the best philosophical minds in early twentieth century Germany (76) and who was knowledgeable about the work of Anglophone philosophers such as Dewey and Royce. Znamierowski's theory emphasizes the need for the participants in a "society in the generic sense" to be aware of each other and to consciously act on the basis of this awareness (79). He is thus primarily interested in social action and interaction (87). Considering Znamierowski's obscurity and the chapter's brevity it would have been helpful to translate and include a few longer quotes from his writings, just to give readers a sense of his philosophical style.

Co-editor Hans Bernhard Schmid writes about the Swiss philosopher Hermann Schmalenbach. Schmid presents Schmalenbach's fascinating theory of communions, i.e., societal groups where "people unite in the pursuit of a shared purpose, or in the sharing of a joint focus" (198). Schmid argues convincingly that such communions are held together by something like a "plural implicit self-knowledge" (212), thereby connecting systematically two aspects of Schmalenbach's philosophy of Geist that at first glance might seem disjointed.

Finally, Genki Uemura and Toru Yaegashi. introduce the social philosophy of Japanese thinker Tomoo Otaka drawing on both his German and Japanese writings. Otaka sets out to articulate a radically anti-individualistic view, according to which "society is to be regarded as the basis from which each individual is somehow derived" (359). Otaka draws creatively on a number of phenomenologists, including primarily Husserl, in order to develop a syncretic and original approach to the ontological nature of the state.

Let me conclude with a brief remark on the demographics of this volume. Only two of the contributors are native speakers of English and only one of them works at an Anglo-American institution. This could either be just a coincidence, or it could be a symptom of the lingering difficulty of generating interest outside the Continent in non-mainstream, and yet valuable, philosophical ideas from the past, especially when the primary literature is not available in English translation. The contributors of this volume worked hard to highlight substantial systematic connections between phenomenology and issues in contemporary analytic philosophy of sociality. Will contemporary analytic philosophers of sociality find it in their hearts to care? That is hard to tell. Meanwhile, one can only hope that some of the writings discussed in this volume will be translated some day, and that the thinkers under scrutiny will receive growing attention both in connection with and beyond contemporary mainstream debates.

[1] Incidentally, in the opening essay on "Persons and Acts - Collective and Social. From Ontology to Politics", Mulligan advances the same claim, albeit in passing, and writes that for Scheler there is no "bearer of or behind the acts of a social, collective person" (29).