The Philosopher: A History in Six Types

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Justin E.H. Smith, The Philosopher: A History in Six Types, Princeton University Press, 2016, 272pp. $27.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691163277.

Reviewed by Christopher Hamilton, King's College London


When I first went to university to read philosophy, I arrived full of burning existential questions about life, its confusions and meaning, and was pleased when my teachers assured me that philosophy was, as I had read before I arrived, the love of wisdom, and that philosophers made the question 'What is philosophy?' part of their very subject matter. But it seemed to me that they forgot about wisdom on day one of teaching and none of them engaged the students in any serious reflection on the nature of philosophy. On the contrary, they seemed content to work within a particular understanding of it, and I remained dismayed that in, for example, my ethics classes the novels, plays and poems I had begun to love, and which seemed to me full of wisdom and obviously to be talking about the same things as were, say, Kant and Hume -- good and evil -- were never once mentioned.

I have spent my whole life wondering what philosophy is and what its relation to wisdom might be.

Justin E. H. Smith's route to these worries is similar to mine, since, as he indicates, although he started off pretty much accepting the prevailing way of doing philosophy in the English-speaking world, he began to grow sceptical when undertaking graduate work. I have found his book, 'an essay in the proper Montaignean sense, [that] seeks to answer the most fundamental of philosophical questions: What is philosophy?' (p.1), and which expresses his scepticism, to be immensely enjoyable and helpful.

His approach is to explore 'what people have been doing under the banner of philosophy in different times and places' (p.1), rather than to offer any argument as to what it is, or ought to be. Each chapter explores one way of doing philosophy in this sense and features a figure. Each such figure has been considered a philosopher, even though they are different from one another and do philosophy in ways that contemporary (analytic) philosophers would hardly recognise to be philosophy at all. Smith wants to show that 'the activity of philosophy is often more muddled' (p.6) than its contemporary practitioners -- and not just those of the analytic ilk -- suppose, and the tone of his book makes it clear that he wants us to take pleasure in that fact, to enjoy our puzzlement.

Smith's book is thus an attempt to recall us to sobriety about what philosophy is, without even the ambition of ending in anything but aporia. It also has plenty of nice asides about Smith's own life, which are not asides. That is the point.

Chapter 1's character is the Curiosus or Curiosa, familiar in the seventeenth century but now largely forgotten, the kind of philosopher whose real interest was in knowledge of singular things. Philosophy these days tends to repudiate the Curiosus/a: it has a craving for generality, as Wittgenstein remarked, and 'craving' suggests (as so often Wittgenstein's way of proceeding does) an illness. What Smith is after in reminding us of this figure - as, so to speak, an antidote to this illness - is, amongst other things, the sense of wonder that he believes ought never to be lost in philosophy. A host of philosophers from Thales and Aristotle to Leibniz all paid attention to the workings of singular things as part of what they conceived of as philosophy. We have lost this sense because we have turned over such matters to the scientists, but this leaves philosophy impoverished.

It would, of course, serve little purpose to insist that a discipline that concerns itself with knowledge of singular things is not philosophy, for that would simply be an expression of a particular question-begging conception of what philosophy is and miss Smith's point. This applies also to his other attempts to shake things up. Naturally one could go on saying that one does not want to do that kind of philosophy, but this, surely, would go against the philosophical spirit, which starts off, it is to be hoped, in curiosity and open-mindedness. It is peculiar that one begins in philosophy eager to learn, puzzled, and loses that so quickly in seeking to defend the 'position' one has developed on some philosophical issue.

There is an extremely important issue here concerning how singular things enter into philosophy. In Chapter 3, whose figure is the Gadfly, the philosopher who understands his social role as that of 'correcting, to the extent possible, the myopic views and misunderstandings of the members of his own society' (p.15), Smith draws on Montaigne for his independent-mindedness, noting how Montaigne speaks so freely of himself: the singular thing in which he is interested is himself. He is at the start of the European fascination with 'the individual subject as something irreducibly salient, as inherently worthy of notice' (p.125). So far, so familiar. Smith also suggests, however, and surely rightly, that Montaigne is interested in showing up the peculiarities of his own self, of himself, as part of a strategy of pushing the reader to recognise his or her own peculiarities: it is a universal truth about human beings that we are each highly peculiar. In this spirit, Smith tells of his preferences for eating, as Montaigne tells us of his (his favourite fruit was melon) -- 'I adore jalapeños and Tabasco sauce . . . I am impatient and voracious: I eat fast, and I like for the experience to bring me to the threshold of pain'. He adds: 'I suspect a good deal could be learned about what and how I think by attention to what and how I eat' (p.128).

I have long been convinced of Smith's point: the idea that a philosopher's reflections bear no interesting relation to the rest of his or her way of going about life has always struck me as highly suspect. In that sense, I don't much believe, as Smith clearly doesn't, in one central and typical way of conceptualising the objectivity of the philosopher's reasoning. For sure, the connections in question are highly likely to be messy and hard to understand. And it is no doubt also the case that there are other relevant factors to which one should attend in reflecting on a philosopher's thinking -- the general political, social, religious etc. conditions of his or her world. But, in a given case, eating habits might be highly relevant. There seems to something insatiable in Smith's eating habits, as in his philosophical writing.

But philosophers lack any serious understanding of the relation between individual personality and philosophy, as they lack any serious sociology or anthropology of their own discipline. Indeed, they are not interested in such things, generally speaking, and it is part of Smith's complaint that philosophers really need to interest themselves in them, on pain of isolating their thinking from much that will enrich it and allowing it to become an entrenched defensiveness, lacking contact with life (there are more books about books than books about life, remarked Montaigne). The frustrating thing is that that entrenched defensiveness is often thought of by philosophers as the peculiar glory of their discipline: here its obsession with purity comes through.

One form of such defensiveness, as Smith points out, is the condescension with which those who have not been through a formal process of education at university are treated when they speak of 'my philosophy' or 'my philosophy of life'. But such condescension is out of place when a person who has lived a rich life seeks to reflect on things and find an orientation to the world that fits with his or her temperament and makes sense of the chaos of experience (p.106). It is the loss of professionally trained philosophers if they have no ears to hear, and it is their narrowness that means that they cannot see that such cases show the way in which 'all is philosophy' (p.49). Professional philosophers have largely lost the notion that there is a clear sense in which a view that offers 'interesting and compelling observations about the world and our place in it' (p.234) is a philosophy and is worth listening to, whether or not the person offering such a view has had a formal training in the subject through socially sanctioned academic institutions or obeys the stifling rules such institutions impose on their denizens.

Chapter 2's figure is the Sage, the paradigm case of which is Socrates, someone who has 'mastered . . . [his or her] culture's forms of reasoning, and has exhibited swift intelligence in questioning these forms and in exposing their presuppositions and shortcomings' (118). Socrates is also, of course, a kind of Gadfly, but Smith prefers to think of him more in the former role 'since he does not have a positive program [of the philosophe engagé or true Gadfly] to replace the various ill-conceived beliefs and plans of his contemporaries' (p.15). This chapter is replete with interesting reflections on philosophy's lack of interest in rural forms of thought, which 'occludes from view many extremely valuable insights about the nature and formation of moral commitments to animals, to the environment, to ancestors' (p.79); on the idea that all philosophy, including its professional version, is folk-philosophy or ethnophilosophy (p.114); on philosophy's genealogical relation to economic 'transactional records and early oral epic poetry' (p.73); and much else besides. The general upshot of his discussion, so far as I can see, is this: if philosophy really is, as its professional practitioners suppose, the activity that 'is concerned with finding truth . . . with universal truths, to be discovered by a priori reflection' (p.4), how is it that philosophers have clearly not arrived at truths on which they agree but, rather, carry out an activity that is characterised by interminable dispute and discussion? It is here that we badly need that better understanding of the personal and social roots of any given philosopher's philosophy, and I believe, with Nietzsche and William James, that what this would show, roughly speaking, is that different philosophers articulate different conceptions of the world and our place in it, as do poets, novelists, filmmakers and many others, including ordinary people. Philosophers take these visions to be the truth, whereas they are more like imaginative visions or pictures that flow from and appeal to temperament, sensibility, cast of mind and the like. Smith, I think, would agree.

Chapter 3 is, in fact, largely concerned with the difficulty philosophy has in demarcating itself from poetry -- Whitman and T.S. Eliot are Smith's key examples -- since poets often offer philosophical views, insights, etc., and philosophy can be written in poetry and sometimes helps itself to metaphor and other literary devices. There are deep and troubling questions here about the extent to which, and ways in which, texts convince us on account of their style, tone, imagery, structural organisation, resonances and associations of language, evocativeness, capacity to move and so on. None of this is well understood. But what seems to me clear is that the style of contemporary English-speaking philosophy -- its very neutrality of style -- is, indeed, a style nonetheless, one that appeals to a certain cast of mind and temperament. Philosophers often overlook this, as if its very neutrality were what we need to get at the truth, when this is, or should be, something to think about philosophically. I know many highly intelligent people who reject philosophy's desire to get clear on so much in this way because they think that philosophers are not good at seeing where a push to clarity is a betrayal of the material being discussed. I am far from sure they are mistaken.

Chapter 4, whose figure is the Ascetic, reminds us that well into the early modern period in the West, philosophy had the central aim of integrating theory and practice with the ultimate aim of 'helping us to be happy' (p.160). In the ancient world, this practice was often partly one of bodily discipline, as it continued to be in discipline of Yoga in the Indian tradition. All of that is pretty much alien to contemporary Anglophone philosophy, of course, whose representative, in Chapter 5, Smith calls the Mandarin: the Mandarin is, roughly speaking, the philosopher who is the product of, and wishes to perpetuate, the highly professionalised kind of philosophy typical of contemporary -- especially, but not only, French -- academic institutions of high reputation. But, of course, as Smith reminds us, those who are the products of a such a system are aware that most of those on whom they draw and write were not themselves such products, and, further, they continue to disagree about what philosophy is. 'None of us really knows what a philosopher is, or what one must do in order to count as a philosopher' (p.193). I have met many philosophers who would say Smith is mistaken, that we do know, but it invariably turns out that they mean that a philosopher is someone who does whatever it is that they do.

Relevant here is the opposition between analytic and so-called Continental philosophy, which Smith sees as one version of the 'two-cultures problem' (p.206). His general suggestion about how to overcome that divide is that professional philosophers stop treating certain texts in a quasi-scriptural way -- he is surely right that the presumption that we know in advance which are the major and which the minor and derivative texts 'rests on nothing more than faith or indifference' (p.210) -- and seek to operate a kind of 'distant reading' (p.211), in which we refuse to shut out 'consideration of what might have been happening around or before the production of that text that caused it to say what it does' (p.211). Smith's preferred approach is one 'that does not insist that one can arrive at the truth simply by reading a text in view of its truth or falsehood . . . while refusing to set up rules at the outset for where legitimate sources of [answering philosophical questions] might be found' (pp.215-6).

Smith's final chapter, whose figure is the Courtier, worries about the relation between money and philosophy. Smith points out that professional philosophers, paid to teach, are Sophists, but like to overlook this fact. It true that there is a difference between getting paid and selling out (p.236). But, in an era of 'research outputs', 'grant capture', the Research Excellence Framework (in the UK), 'impact case studies', league tables, 'graduate employment destinations' and the rest of the apparatus of the modern bureaucratised university, can we really be so sure we haven't sold out?

This is a lovely book: honest and open-minded, it is seeking to do something genuinely important. I wish more books in philosophy were as generous as this one is in its desire to hold things open and in its willingness genuinely to listen to multiple voices.