The Philosopher in Early Modern Europe: The Nature of a Contested Identity

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Conal Condren, Stephen Gaukroger, and Ian Hunter (eds.), The Philosopher in Early Modern Europe: The Nature of a Contested Identity, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 281pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521866464.

Reviewed by William Uzgalis, Oregon State University


The Philosopher in Early Modern Europe: The Nature of a Contested Identity is a collection of eleven essays which includes discussions of philosophy in Germany, France, and England during a period that ranges from a late medieval woman, Christine de Pisan, through such Renaissance figures as Thomas More and Erasmus, and ends with Descartes, Hobbes, Margaret Cavendish, Boyle and Locke.  Two of the essays deal with judicial figures, Matthew Hale and Althusius.  The editors' introduction to the book reflects on the approach taken by the authors of the essays.  The editors claim that, "[v]iewed from a post-Kantian vantage, the landscape of sixteenth- and seventeenth-century philosophy appears as a foreign country." (p. 5)  They tell us that in order to recover "understandings of philosophy not easily assimilated to the current self-understandings of the discipline", their volume "argues for a more thoroughly historical approach to the history of early modern philosophy."  To do this, the volume focuses on "the complementary phenomena of the contested character of philosophy, and the persona necessary for its practice, that is, the purpose built 'self' whose cognitive capacities and moral bearing are cultivated for the sake of a knowledge deemed philosophical." (p. 7)  The authors of five of the essays in the collection have the term 'persona' in their titles.  Almost all of the others deal with this notion explicitly.  The notion of persona is again connected to the difference between post-Kantian philosophy and that of the early modern period.  I cannot comment on all of the essays in this volume, so I will briefly discuss some of the points the editors make about the history of philosophy and try to show by commenting on a number of the essays the direction the book takes in exploring the history of modern philosophy historically.

The editors remark that while the history of philosophy is highly contested and thus has a degree of diversity, there are two poles that define the limits of the relation between philosophy and its history.  The first is that philosophy is essentially historical and that one must see the contingent and variable nature of philosophical problems in order to understand the answers philosophers give to them.  The second is that the history of philosophy is impossible because "whereas historians infer and reconstruct from surviving evidence a philosophical proposition, the thought of a given philosopher is always in the present." (p. 4)  They remark that neither of these poles seems very satisfactory and that it would seem that all one has to do is to find some middle position.  They hold, however, that this is not quite the case, for one reason because "it begs the question of whose criteria are to be used in judging an account of a philosopher from an earlier time insofar as historians and philosophers have diverging interests." (p. 4)  Another problem is what the editors call "the degree to which it is possible to avoid the difficulties associated with the specific genre of philosophical history." (p. 4)  What they mean by 'philosophical history' is, apparently, a Kantian or Hegelian approach to history and the history of philosophy.  They note that this kind of approach "is so structured that historical events unfold as the means of solving present philosophical problems." (p. 4)  This kind of philosophical history seems prone to an approach to the history of philosophy that concludes 'it all leads up to me'.  (While it may be true that the Kantian and Hegelian histories of philosophy clearly have this feature, it is also the case that histories of philosophy written by such great philosophers as Aristotle and Bertrand Russell show exactly the same tendency.)  Following on from this kind of view of philosophical history, the editors suggest that "the history of philosophy has remained largely in the hands of philosophers as a tool of doctrinal exploration and justification." (p. 2)  Much of this critique is on the mark.

The new approach is presumably intended as a corrective to these flawed approaches.  The essays by Saunders and von Friedberg about the construction of judicial personae display the diversity of views of the philosophical enterprise during this period.  The editors remark that "[w]hat philosophy might be is a matter of historical investigation of the activities that have been called 'philosophy' regardless of whether to modern eyes these activities resemble post-Kantian epistemology, and regardless of whether they look more like theology, poetry, polemics or natural science." (p. 5)  They go on to remark that the "range of disciplines classified as philosophy was larger and more diverse than it became in the late eighteenth century." (p. 5)  They then quote Joseph Friedman, who studied the disciplines that counted as philosophy in the universities during this period.  Friedman remarks: "the nine disciplines that most frequently appeared … were metaphysics, physics, mathematics, ethics, family life, politics, logic, rhetoric and grammar."  The editors then remark:

Once we recall that physics typically comprised the main Aristotelian works of natural philosophy -- The Heavens, On Generation and Corruption, Meteorology, On the World, and On the Soul -- and that mathematics included the musical and astronomical disciplines in addition to geometry and arithmetic, and that politics could embrace jurisprudence, the full diversity of the philosophical domains begins to appear. (pp. 5-6) 

Presumably it is the claim that politics could embrace jurisprudence that is the justification for including the essays about Matthew Hale and Althusius in the volume.

A number of the essays examine the social and intellectual context in which philosophers during this period lived and worked.  This leads us to see some of the ways in which the identity of philosophy was contested.  Ian Hunter's essay shows us how the struggle between Catholics and Protestants in early modern Germany led to the creation of competing institutions of learning and competing Protestant and Catholic philosophical educations rather than the movement of ideas towards Kant or Hegel.  He tells us that the Jesuits, who only spent three years of their careers teaching philosophy, did not teach philosophy as the cultivation of a particular philosophical persona, while Protestants did.  He also explains why Catholic philosophy was more stable and less open to current innovation than that produced in the less regulated Protestant universities.  Searjeantson's interesting essay on Hobbes and the universities adds to this picture by presenting Hobbes' attack on the scholastic philosophy and religious politics of the English universities as part of the death knell of a European university system in which there was uniformity of curriculum and a fruitful association of philosophy and theology.

The essays, as noted earlier, are focused around the term 'persona' as a characteristic feature of this period.  We rarely take seriously the connections between poetry, drama and other forms of literature with philosophy characteristic of the early modern period.  Catherine Curtis' essay shows philosophers, including Thomas More, Erasmus and others, using various models from the ancient and medieval world, including satire, fiction and dialogue, for a variety of purposes connected with their philosophical personae.  It seems that the focus on the persona of the philosopher is a feature that these scholars believe is important for this particular period in the history of philosophy rather than characteristic of a general method for treating any period in the history of philosophy.  Several of the authors remark that after this period philosophy loses the notion of a philosophical persona and the associated view of philosophy as a way of life.  I believe that this point is intended as a criticism of contemporary philosophy.  We may see this critique illustrated, as well as the complexity of the term 'persona', by looking at John Cottingham's essay on Descartes in this volume.

In his essay Cottingham argues that the way we understand Descartes is limited and that a new interpretation focusing on Descartes as a theistic neo-Platonic ethicist might be more revealing and inclusive than either the interpretation of Descartes as an anti-skeptical epistemologist or as a scientist offering mechanistic explanations of phenomena, even the phenomena of human cognition.  Cottingham's essay also reveals some of the ambiguities in the conception(s) of a persona.  So, it is perhaps worth pursuing in some detail.  Cottingham quotes Descartes' earliest notebook where he says that just as actors come onto the stage masked, he himself will enter the theater of the world masked. (p. 182)  Often we think of masks as concealing.  Cottingham notes that the mask has a psychological role for the actor: it hides awkwardness and embarrassment.  It allows the actor to pronounce his lines with more confidence.  If this were all there were to it, however, it would be of little importance.  But, Cottingham tells us that Descartes had a mission.  Descartes claimed that the sciences in his epoch were masked in the "formal, stylized apparatus of scholasticism.  If their masks could be shed, they would appear in their full beauty." (p. 183)  Yet in pursuing this goal we do not leave the person behind with the mask.  For Cottingham now invokes a new meaning of 'persona' related to the use of persons in the Trinity: as a way in which a human being forms a true self-conception of him- or herself. What then, is this true conception of the self that Descartes sought to reveal?  Cottingham rejects the common conception of Descartes' aim or role or persona in the Meditations as an epistemologist attempting to defeat skepticism.  He sees this interpretation as a reflection more of the academic and impractical nature of analytic philosophy than of Cartesian philosophy.  Descartes, after all, saw the Evil Demon hypothesis as a form of hyperbolic doubt, whereas analytic philosophers seem to think they should take its descendent, the brain in a vat scenario, quite seriously.  He also thinks that the competing interpretation of Descartes as a scientist aiming to give mechanical explanations of a whole range of phenomena including aspects of human cognition, while vastly more plausible than that of Descartes the epistemologist, fails to explain Descartes' dualism and the role of the immaterial res cogitans in Descartes' philosophy.  In place of these two interpretations, as noted above, Cottingham offers a third.  This one is of a neo-Platonic Christian ethicist who sees all philosophical activity as an integrated search for human happiness.  This is the real persona of Descartes as philosopher.  The role of many of the arguments in the Meditations and other works, then, is to turn us from the senses to the contemplation of God and to see the role of reason as aimed at helping us to accurately determine the will and thus choose what is best.  However persuasive this interpretation of Descartes may be (and I confess I find it very impressive), it seems to me to be too neat.  Perhaps what we really need is some combination of all three of these hypotheses with their competing goals and the messy consequences that would follow.  Did Descartes really need an Evil Demon and the hyperbolic doubt associated with it in the pursuit of his neo-Platonic vision?  Why did he need an immaterial and unexplanatory res cogitans?  Plainly Locke thought one could do without them both for the purposes of ethics and religion.  Perhaps they are reflections of Descartes' neo-Platonic dualism.  But if so, they conflict with other goals that Descartes was clearly pursuing and thus limit the completeness of Cottingham's interpretation of the Cartesian persona.  In a similar vein, it is worth noting that Cottingham's picture of the sterility of contemporary analytic epistemology is also much too neat.

Karen Green and Jacqueline Broad argue that comparing Christine de Pisan and Margaret Cavendish shows that the advent of the philosophical persona of the genderless, disembodied Cartesian meditator did not empower women as philosophers as much as some commentators have supposed.  Pisan came significantly before Descartes, while Cavendish was twenty-seven when the great French philosopher died.  The implicit supposition, then, is that on the basis of what the commentators say, Cavendish should have done significantly better at being accepted as a woman philosopher because of the influence of Descartes.  But she didn't.  Pisan was significantly more successful than Cavendish in the male-dominated world of philosophy.  It is a little hard to say whether Cavendish's chronological proximity to the great French philosopher strengthens or weakens the argument.  However, if the point is that we need a more nuanced view of why women were at some times successful and at other times not in making their philosophical voices heard, this seems like a perfectly reasonable request to make.  Surely issues about class and patronage and how well the views of women philosophers were in step with those of their contemporaries are likely to play a more significant role in explaining the different philosophical fortunes of these two women than Descartes' dualism.  Clearly also the progress of women towards equality in a whole variety of areas has not been linear.  Antonia Fraser made this point long ago and quite convincingly in her study of women in the 17th century, The Weaker Vessel.  Thus, Queen Elisabeth was educated significantly better than Queen Anne for their role in life.

Richard Yeo contrasts Locke's struggles to acquire a vocation and a philosophical persona with that constructed for him after his death.  While I think there is much to say on behalf of Yeo's account, it seems to me that focusing on Locke as an under-laborer to the natural scientists somewhat misses the fundamental point of the Essay for the construction of a philosophical persona.  Locke's view in his chapter on personal identity that an essential concomitant of consciousness is the pursuit of happiness and the avoidance of misery leads naturally to the moral determinism of Book II, Chapter XXI and the importance of inquiry for all of us in becoming mature and autonomous persons who can achieve the good both in this life and the next.  Locke's interest in science seems to me largely to follow from the fact that scientists are the best of us at effective inquiry.  After the work of the under-laborer is done, it becomes a model for how we should all proceed.  He wants all of us to become as proficient as our circumstances will allow at inquiry, but the inquiry he thinks the great majority of humanity is fitted to engage in is about ethics and religion, not science.  (See Essay, IV. XII. 10: p. 645 in the Nidditch edition.)

I think the book succeeds very well in showing us how different early modern philosophy is from post-Kantian conceptions of philosophy, and the wealth of things to be discovered by looking at things historically and at least somewhat apart from our immediate philosophical interests.  After reading it, we might well say about the figures of early modern philosophy what Miranda said in the Tempest upon discovering those alluring men: "O wonder!  How many goodly creatures are there here!  How beautiful mankind is!  O brave new world: That has such people in it!"