The Philosophical Foundations of Early German Romanticism

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Manfred Frank, The Philosophical Foundations of Early German Romanticism, translated by Elizabeth Millan-Zaibert, SUNY Press, 2004, 286pp, $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 0791459470

Reviewed by Fred Rush, University of Notre Dame


In the heady decade following the completion of Kant’s critical system, German philosophy experienced one of its most concentrated and imaginative periods. Some have compared it to the advent of Western philosophy in fourth-century Athens, others, reaching to metaphor in an attempt to outstrip even that effusive comparison, have described it as a ‘supernova’. This latter, astronomical figure pushes through what overstatement it contains to capture a salient truth about German philosophy of the later eighteenth and early nineteenth centuries. Spurred on by the revolutionary work of Kant, philosophers of the next generation proposed changes and amendments to what they took to be Kant’s central insights with stunning alacrity and explosive systematic complexity. But a supernova is a star in its death throes, after a time leaving in its wake a cold, desolate waste. And so it was. Hegel’s powerful reformulation of the post-Kantian idealist project was in crisis soon after his death; and, though there is an elaborate and intermittently interesting form of neo-Kantianism that lives on in the ‘school philosophy’ of mid- and later-nineteenth-century Germany, the philosophy that was to come to most matter was a severe rebuke to idealism in the form of numerous versions of ‘materialism’ or ‘naturalism.’ Schopenhauer and the later Schelling were, so to speak, internal operatives in this reaction. Feuerbach, Marx, Nietzsche and Mach are all also, in their own ways, illustrative. To be sure, certain elements of idealism lived on – the importance of the concept ‘experience’ to later nineteenth and early twentieth century philosophy is ample indication of that – but it has often seemed most promising to retain, at least partly, Kant’s version of idealism, not the later extrusions of systematic German philosophy.

This sketch is importantly incomplete, for it leaves out a significant line of reaction to idealism that was contemporaneous with it. Manfred Frank’s The Philosophical Foundations of Early German Romanticism considers just this strand of thought, one that began as an internal critique of idealism and then developed into one of its main competitors: early German romanticism. The book under review is a translation of a manuscript which was later to form some of the central portions of “Unendliche Annährung”: Die Anfänge der philosophischen Frühromantik (1998), Frank’s protean and pioneering study of the period, which weighs in at 950 pages. English-only readers can be very glad indeed for this 250- page synopsis, although those with German will want to work carefully through the original as well. The larger work is the most comprehensive and thoroughgoing study of early German romanticism, easily superseding prior treatments. It is surely one of the most important books from the post-War period on the history of German philosophy.

Early German romanticism had intellectual centers in Tübingen, Homburg and Berlin, but Jena, then the epicenter for things Kantian, has special importance. Karl Leonhard Reinhold had taken an appointment to the first chair of Kantian philosophy established in Germany there, and was followed in that chair by Fichte, whose lectures of the early 1790s were the primary point of dissemination of the new idealist ‘improvements’ on Kant. Jena was also the home to a range of views very critical of Fichte , which constitute what may well be called the first ‘back to Kant’ movement. These recalcitrants were very important to the early romantics, as was Jacobi. The most important of the romantics philosophically are undoubtedly the ‘three Friedrichs’: Hölderlin, von Hardenburg (Novalis) and Schlegel, and Frank builds his narrative largely around them. But he also gives extended and needed treatment to several less prominent figures who are worth independent consideration. Among this supporting cast are Carl Immanuel Diez (Schelling, Hegel and Hölderlin’s teacher at the Tübinger Stift), Johann Benjamin Erhard, Carl Christian Erhard Schmid (a teacher of Novalis), Immanuel Niethammer, Isaac von Sinclair (known principally as a correspondent and friend of Hegel), and Jakob Zwilling. Schelling, whose views remained closer to those of Fichte in some respects yet differed substantially from them in others, is also treated.

The early romantics forwarded a system-skeptical, non-foundationalist alternative to idealism, while sharing its central concern for freedom as autonomy. Two related strategies are central to German romanticism: (1) a critical appraisal of the Fichtean project of discovering an ultimate principle that governs, and indeed makes possible at all, object-consciousness, which principle, in turn, forms the basis for a monistic systematic foundationalism and (2) claiming that, in the face of monistic foundationalism’s bankruptcy, that certain kinds of artistic practice best indicate both the limits placed upon finite intelligence that Fichte ignores and the experiential effects of those limits under the condition of having to strive to transcend them nonetheless. In a carefully constrained sense, art can go where theory cannot for the romantics, although the art that will go the farthest will be fairly self-consciously theoretical. One must judge the philosophical import of early German romanticism on the basis of whether the critique of Fichte is well-taken and whether the strategies meant to replace the foundationalist project are coherent and compelling.

Fichte was concerned to establish for Kant’s philosophy what he took to be a deeper and more stable basis. There are many ways to describe this project – some taking as central Fichte’s dislike of Kant faculty psychology or the doctrine of things in themselves, others focusing more on Fichte’s concern with dualism and skepticism – but Frank does well to concentrate on the theory of judgment as a unifying theme amongst the romantic reactions to Fichte. Frank’s treatment of the basic issue here--i.e. the various attempts to limn judgment form as it was then understood for a type of identity thought to underlie any relational notion of the same--is very convincing and clear. The obsession with questions of the necessary preconditions for intentional consciousness, coupled with the idea that distinctness requires subjective cognitive activity, forces upon one the idea of the pre-conscious or non-objectual conscious as a teeming, chaotic realm of absolute non-differentiation (from any point of view that concept-wielding, discursive creatures could enjoy). But Hölderlin, Novalis and Schlegel argue, each in his own way, that this idea of identity (or of ‘the Absolute’), transcendentally necessary though it is, is merely what Kant calls a regulative idea (29). Indeed, Kant says as much himself in various obiter dicta. Such an idea can never be presented in experience through an instance of it, since it is claimed that non-relational identity is what makes objectual experience possible in the first place. If this is so, then the principle cannot form the basis for a philosophical ‘science’ in Fichte’s sense because it is not an item of knowledge from which other less basic knowable propositions may be deduced. Frank does not extend the point to its limit—and this is decidedly not a Kantian point, but more one inherited from Jacobi—that the romantics view any object as but a partial expression of a regulative idea or as ‘regulative’. What determinateness and fixity an object has is always incomplete and only as good as the determinateness of the concepts that subsume them. That is not categorially limited and is wholly partial, depending upon complex cognitive and conative background conditions afforded by other concepts and feelings. That is, romanticism is committed to a form of conceptual holism that is not constrained by a final set of overarching concepts.

What one is to do in this event is to accept the regulative nature of the posit, correct one’s account of philosophical systematicity in order to reflect that fact and engage in a project of properly displaying infinite striving within the limitations of finite understanding. In Hölderlin this takes the form of living in the interstices of being and becoming, a felt tension between acknowledging the transient and having to live with some fixity. Although the discovery of early philosophical writings of Hölderlin illuminates his views on judgment, no account of the originality and importance of his thought can neglect a painstaking engagement with his poetry. Moreover, any such account must reckon with very robust philosophical readings of these works by Dilthey, Heidegger, Henrich, and Szondi. Frank’s other writings show a vast knowledge of literature and great subtlety in its interpretation (e.g. Einführung in die frühromantische Ästhetik (1989)). It is therefore a pity that this book does not include at least indications of how he would handle this very difficult corpus. Perhaps it is too much to ask in a book of this scope to devote more attention to Hölderlin’s poetic practice for, once one sets oneself the task of coming to grips with it, one is well on the way to another book (or so). But we have so few of Hölderlin’s essays to consider that leaving the literary output entirely out of the discussion mitigates the perception of his importance.

For Novalis, expressing the limitations of discursive thought within that thought means instituting an imaginary practice of making more distant those things that seem most ordinary to us (thereby stressing the impossibility of fighting through given descriptions of them all the way back to a point at which things are indescribable singularities) and bringing closer those things that seem most foreign (so as to acknowledge them as expressions of the Absolute). Frank has done pioneering work in Novalis’s importance, especially in connection with the so-called Fichte-Studien, and his understanding of Novalis’s project is most impressive. His exposition of Novalis’s views on judgment and intellectual intuition (164f.), on the role of feeling in philosophy (169f.), and on self-consciousness are clear, astute and situated well in their rich historical context. Again, attention is not paid to Novalis’s literary pursuits, but this is less egregious here, both because Novalis left behind much more in the way of strictly philosophical work than did Hölderlin and--a bit more arguable, perhaps--Novalis’s literary output does not carry as much philosophical weight as do the lyrics and elegies of Hölderlin.

Schlegel makes what is in many ways the most interesting attempt to incorporate within discursive limitations the idea of a non-discursive ground in his concepts of irony and philosophical fragmentation. It is my sense that, although Frank is most impressed with Novalis’ critique of Fichte, he would admit that it is Schlegel who has the apparatus to show to best effect what is most interesting about the picture that early romanticism seeks to put in the place of idealism. The Philosophical Foundations of Early German Romanticism ends with two chapters devoted entirely to Schlegel. It is here that I find the book a bit less persuasive than it might be. Schlegel’s concept of irony is very intricate when one gets below the surface of rhetoric and polemic, but if one remains on the surface, his views can seem philosophically implausible, innocuous, or even silly. Of course, Frank does not remain on the surface, but the reconstruction presented here is truncated and problematic. The problem is that Frank tends to assimilate irony to Schlegel’s idea of “reciprocal proof” (Wechselerweis) that is developed later (193-7). Frank is quite right to point out the borrowing from Fichte here, and that is perhaps what accounts for the particular sort of reciprocity that Schlegel holds characteristic of Wechselerweis, i.e. one of an ‘oscillating’ (Schweben) between two mutually determining contents or propositions. This is a crucial Schlegelian idea and another way of saying what I have already mentioned above – that any determination of content is provisional upon co-determination by all other contents and, therefore, when viewed at a philosophical remove (or as Schlegel likes to say ‘critically’), that determination rests in systematic indeterminacy. Frank’s reconstruction of irony can at times seem limited to this structure. Accordingly he views irony as involving placing side-by-side mutually determining yet incompatible contents, so that they ‘negate’ or ‘dissolve’ one another, and it is this negation that consummates, if that is the word, irony. So stated, irony threatens to become trivial, mundane, or self-stultifying (just as Hegel said it was). For one thing, the same stated effect might be achieved by contrasting any proposition with its negation. What is missing from the account is that the content of what Schlegel contrasts in his philosophical ‘fragments’ is very selective, philosophical, and often highly charged. While Frank captures part of Schlegel’s idea of what sort of systematicity is appropriate to a philosophy composed of fragments, he does not discuss the difficult epistemological and metaphysical issues with irony, i.e. the senses in which Schlegel’s views are properly considered ‘perspectivist’, what epistemic properties are supposed to characterize holding a view ‘ironically’, how it is that art is ‘ironic’ and what that has to do with the form that philosophy should take. Nor is there substantial discussion of the substance of Schlegel’s fragments – of which views he holds ironically or thinks are important to set side-by-side ironically. Irony is not a fungible structure for Schlegel; it is a medium for expression concerning the Absolute. Some remarks at the very end of the book point in the direction of a discussion of some of this terrain, but they are not by themselves enough (218). A stronger case has to be made for how irony limns the contrast between what can be said and what is ‘unsayable’ by multiplying the former to show the infinite plasticity and transcendence of the latter. Schlegelian irony corrugates ideas, it does not flatten them out by merely negating them.

A final niggle: it is something of a leitmotiv in the book that the romantics are to be preferred to the idealists because romanticism is a form of ‘realism’ (cf. Fred Beiser’s recent treatment of related issues). Frank deploys ‘realism’ rather broadly and in different senses, some of which require quite a lot to be said about the sense of realism at issue in order to bring the view into a recognizably realist camp, e.g. the connection Frank makes between the realism of romanticism and the coherence theory of truth (197, 208-9). I am not sure that tagging things ‘realist’, ‘idealist’, ‘anti-realist’, etc. is ever very helpful; regardless, Frank might have said more about what forms of ‘realism’ and ‘idealism’ are in question.

Notwithstanding my wishes that more of what ended up in the larger German book had been included here, The Philosophical Foundations of Early German Romanticism is the best discussion of the philosophical complexities of Jena romanticism that I know of in English. It should spur renewed interest in philosophical romanticism and set scholars to investigating the rest of Frank’s very substantial and influential work in this area.