The Philosophical Hitchcock: Vertigo and the Anxieties of Unknowingness

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Robert B. Pippin, The Philosophical Hitchcock: Vertigo and the Anxieties of Unknowingness, University of Chicago Press, 2017, 132pp., $29.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226503646.

Reviewed by Murray Smith, University of Kent


The book is Robert Pippin's most recent monographic excursion into the world of film art. Perhaps it is unfair to describe it as an 'excursion,' since Pippin's substantial publication record includes two earlier books on film -- Hollywood Westerns and American Myth (2010) and Fatalism in American Film Noir (2012) -- while his (published) interest in the arts more broadly extends back to Modernism as a Philosophical Problem (1991), with Henry James and Modern Moral Life (2000) and After the Beautiful: Hegel and the Philosophy of Pictorial Modernism (2014) following in the new millennium. True, Pippin is best known for his work on Hegel, in Hegel's Idealism (1991) and Hegel on Self-Consciousness (2011) among other works, and Hegel stalks the pages of The Philosophical Hitchcock too -- Pippin cites After the Beautiful as the theoretical statement of the Hegelian ideas informing his interpretation of Hitchcock's 1958 release Vertigo (7). But there is no doubting the seriousness of his engagement with film and his respect for the power of the medium. So by now we should both recognize film as one of Pippin's major preoccupations, and appreciate the degree to which his interest in the medium is integrated with his perspective on Hegel, modernity, and the arts.

Pippin is a distinctive figure among scholars active in the domain(s) where film meets philosophy. Although -- I think it is fair to say -- he is a heavy-duty theoretical philosopher, and as an 'analytic Hegelian' an unusual one at that, in the context of film he aligns himself with a tradition of film appreciation generally known for its scepticism towards theorizing -- at least of the orthodox varieties -- the best-known exemplars of which are Stanley Cavell and Victor Perkins (to whose memory the book is dedicated; Perkins died in 2016). But, as befits this tradition and the dedication to Perkins, Pippin generally carries his theory lightly here, much of it being compressed into the (admittedly often discursive) footnotes. He also honours Perkins with his close and careful attention to film style -- to 'film as film,' in Perkins' words -- whatever the sense in which film may play a philosophical role. This is another feature of the book which indicates how seriously Pippin takes film.

Pippin begins with a prologue outlining the principles of his philosophical approach to film, which we might describe as an effort to discern the philosophy in certain films, following and teasing out the effort of the films themselves to 'disclose' features of the world or our place within it which have a philosophical character. He then sets out, in the introduction, the specific interpretative framework that he uses to approach Vertigo -- a framework significantly though not exclusively inspired by Hegel. The remaining chapters execute the plan set out in these opening two sections. Pippin moves through Vertigo sequentially, beginning with the opening credits and leaving us with the image of Scottie Ferguson stranded atop the San Juan Bautista bell tower, frozen in stricken horror moments after the fall of Judy Barton. Scottie's position at the film's conclusion echoes his predicament in the film's opening scene, dangling from a rooftop, witnessing the fatal fall of a policeman striving to help him; and midway through the film when, unable to follow Madeleine to the top of the bell tower due to his vertigo, he (believes he) sees her fall to her death. Naturally Pippin continually points forwards and backwards, drawing our attention to such parallels and motifs developing across the film, as well as situating it in various wider contexts (ranging from Hitchcock's oeuvre to the rise of modern social relations, as understood by Rousseau and Hegel). Nonetheless, the decision to undergird the analysis of the film with a sequential structure gives it some of the dramatic urgency and suspenseful power of the film itself, Pippin's interpretation working as an evocation and retelling of the film as much as a philosophical commentary on or elucidation of it.

Pippin describes the philosophical theme or problem that he discerns in Vertigo as 'the common struggle for mutual interpretability in a social world where that becomes increasingly difficult and increasingly vital, both for the pursuit of our own interests and for the stability and security of our friendships and romantic relationships' (10; see also 20). This struggle gives rise to the 'anxieties of unknowingness' that figure in the subtitle of Pippin's book: to what extent can I trust the way others, especially intimates, present themselves to me? how much confidence can I have in my own self-understanding, and in particular in my understanding of how I come across, especially to those most important to me? It is plausible to think of the complex dynamics of interpersonal (mis)understanding -- the 'swirl of uncertainty and partial confidence' (17) characteristic of significant human relationships -- as a basic feature of the human condition, and there is some recognition of that thought here. But Pippin is insistent that the struggle for mutual understanding, and the anxieties of unknowingness that attend it, are heightened by the social conditions of modernity.

Hitchcock's world is 'a historical world' (17), as Pippin puts it, though not a past world: in essence, it is the world we still inhabit. And what characterizes that world is an intensifying interaction between our dependence on others, the social inequalities which shape those relations of dependence, and the desire for autonomy which pulls against such dependence. The 'struggle for mutuality . . . becomes more and more difficult in modernity' with the increasing differentiation among value spheres ('church, family, class, ethnicity') and fragmentation of social life (23). Such factors surface in Vertigo in the sharp contrast between the virtually aristocratic Madeleine Elster on the one hand, and Judy Barton -- the lower middle-class woman from small-town Kansas paid to act out the role of Madeleine -- on the other, as well as the colonial backstory concerning Madeleine's ancestor Carlotta Valdez. Barton's performance assumes a power that neither she nor the drama's other participants foresee. Vertigo's many admirers -- the film is routinely ranked at or near the top of 'greatest film of all time' polls -- recognize a similarly remarkable power in Kim Novak's performance as Barton playing Madeleine: one of many parallels, foregrounded by the film, between the story the film tells and the film itself, as Pippin notes (e.g. 61, 98).

The varieties of unknowingness canvassed by Pippin, and on his account dramatized in Vertigo, include plain ignorance (born out of 'simple human finitude,' 73), mistaken assumptions and 'snap judgements' (39), the 'performance' and presentation of the self, deception, denial, obtuseness, self-deception, and fantasy. But at the very heart of unknowingness stands 'the unstable dynamic of love' (86-7) -- conceived by Pippin not just as an intimate relationship between two individuals, but (following the analysis above) one of the pillars of modern bourgeois society (22). That dynamic involves the complex interplay of the actual characters of the individuals, the way each perceives the other, the way each imagines they are perceived by the other, the way each imagines that the other imagines that they are perceived . . . and so on, in a vertiginous mise-en-abyme. (Pippin implies (19) that the film is among those works which render, in artistic form, the vicissitudes of self-consciousness given fully-fledged philosophical articulation in chapter 4 of Hegel's Phenomenology.) Thus Scottie, bent upon reanimating Madeleine, can scarcely perceive the actual Judy, while she retreats from revealing to Scottie the truth about the past in the hope that he might come to love her for her true self. But critically, these compound layers of unknowingness do not rule out the possibility of genuine love and authenticity. In pretending to be Madeleine, Judy is 'acting out a vulnerability that is a lie, even as she is apparently, as we learn later, actually falling in love' (71) with Scottie; later in the story, 'she becomes what she was, the fake Madeleine' (111). And similarly Scottie's love for Madeleine survives his discovery of the plot and Judy's performance; moments before Judy falls to her death, Scottie is declaring his love for Madeleine afresh. Put philosophically, Vertigo shows us that 'having an illusion revealed does not necessarily destroy it' (78). And once again the film embodies or echoes this character transaction in its own structure, showing us that 'a level of emotional investment that can coexist with a realization of . . . subterfuges and deceptions . . . is a feature of the film as a whole' (114; see also 120).

Pippin's interpretation of Vertigo is certainly philosophical. But does Pippin's philosophical account of the film establish that the film itself can be understood as a philosophical work, that the 'philosophical Hitchcock' is one to be discovered in Hitchcock's films, rather than constructed out of them? Pippin concedes in the opening paragraph of his study that his project raises 'two enormous questions: what philosophy is, such that a film could be said to bear on it; and how an art object, a film in particular, must be conceived such that it could intersect with, bear on, philosophy' (1). Later in the prologue he states that he is 'happy to let everything ride on whether some illuminating sense can be made of this one film' (7) against the theoretical backdrop noted above concerning the struggle for mutual recognition in modern social life. But it is unclear that an individual interpretation, no matter how authentically philosophical and no matter how persuasive as an interpretation, can settle the underlying question as to the philosophical character of the film. Moreover, notwithstanding the modesty with which Pippin frames his general comments on this issue -- a 'statement' but 'nothing like a defense of the principles' (1) -- along with fact that the lion's share of the book is given over to the interpretation of Vertigo, a broader defense of 'the idea that a film (or a novel or a poem) . . . can be understood as a form of thought, especially a form of philosophical thought' (3) does emerge across the book.

In considering Pippin's perspective on this matter, we might note the distinction he allows in the passage just quoted, between a 'form of thought' and 'a form of philosophical thought.' It is one thing to recognize that a film embodies the thinking of its makers, and that properly appreciated, it elicits thinking in its audience. It is another thing to claim that it embodies 'a form of philosophical thought.' There are really (at least) three positions, and two debates, in play here. Anti-cognitivists contend that, among the kinds of value we might attribute to works of art (including films), cognitive value plays at best a marginal role. We bring knowledge to works of art in order to understand them, and we may have the impression that our knowledge is deepened by them, but such knowledge is at best trivial and at worst treacherous. Cognitivists, by contrast, recognize that artworks embody various kinds of knowledge, and we learn from them in a range of ways. But one can be a cognitivist and pull up short of granting artworks specifically philosophical power. Only FAPists -- advocates of the 'film-as-philosophy' thesis, or their equivalents in relation other artistic media -- attribute specifically philosophical capacity to films and other artworks.

Pippin notes that the idea of a film acting as a form of philosophical thought sits more readily with philosophers working in those philosophical lineages in which philosophy and the arts are taken to have a 'complementary' relationship, including those traceable to Aristotle, Hegel, Kierkegaard, Schopenhauer, Nietzsche, Heidegger, Wittgenstein, and Cavell. But for any such relationship to hold, certain conditions must be met, central among them generality (10, 20, 22-3). On the face of it, Vertigo is just a tale about particular individuals -- Scottie and Judy and a handful of other characters. Moreover, these are fictional individuals, and (as Pippin notes) very weird ones to boot. What general significance can these idiosyncratic, individual characters possibly have? What licenses us to interpret them as vehicles for more general truths about human self-understanding and self-consciousness?

Individual works in isolation will never yield an answer; what grounds the (potential) cognitive value of the individual work is its place within the overlapping institutions of historical narration, fictional storytelling, and art-making. Within those institutions, one means by which the individual work implies greater generality is via its relations with other films, in particular those films tied to the work in question by genre or by authorship. Pippin pursues the authorial strategy throughout, identifying connections between Vertigo and many of Hitchcock's other films, with Shadow of a Doubt, Notorious, North by Northwest, Psycho, and Marnie being particularly prominent in his account. Pippin explores, for example, how the anxieties of unknowingness play out in Shadow of a Doubt -- most obviously through young Charlie's growing uncertainty about the character and past of her Uncle Charlie, and how she should act on this knowledge once in possession of it. But the more specific, sociohistorical aspect of Pippin's analysis also resonates with the film. Young Charlie's encounter with the reality of her corrupt and murderous uncle occurs at the moment when she seeks to break out and assert her independence from the tedium of her small-town existence in Santa Rosa. In coping with the situation, she discovers at once the extent of her dependence on others, and 'the utter inadequacy of [Santa Rosa's] (or, paradigmatically, her mother's) form of life for being able to take in who [Uncle Charlie] is' (20).

The web of connections among the films of at least some directors, and certain well-defined genres, 'can suggest a sort of mythic universality' (10) Pippin argues (echoing the title of his Hollywood Westerns and American Myth). The idea of 'myth' gets us generality, but it hardly suggests epistemic authority -- certainly not the kind of authority we seek or expect from philosophy. Pippin might appeal here to the Hegelian conception of art, which grants it an important role in the growth of knowledge and self-consciousness. But this is a dangerous, double-edged sword for Pippin to play with: while Hegel credits art with a kind of cognitive power, he also contrasts it with philosophy in this respect, philosophy embodying a more advanced stage in (indeed the culmination of) the emergence of spirit.

At several points, Pippin flirts with what Paisley Livingston terms 'the bold thesis' -- the proposal that, not only can film(s) 'do' philosophy, but that it can discharge certain philosophical functions more effectively than any orthodox philosophy; 'that the exploration of such issues [as mutual interpretability] in film and literature is philosophically indispensable' (20). Philosophy 'as traditionally understood' is too abstract and 'coarse-grained' for such an existential-psycho-ethical philosophical problem; Erving Goffman's seemingly highly-relevant theoretical work on the presentation of the self in everyday life is mentioned only to be immediately and permanently thrown out of bounds (23). Against this current, however, a more moderate and plausible conception of the potential philosophical role of film also flows within the book. In the passage from the opening paragraph I have already quoted, Pippin speaks of films 'intersecting with' or 'bearing on' philosophy; he also notes that Hegel treats art 'as part of a collective attempt at self-knowledge over time, and is viewed not as a competitor with religion or philosophy but as a different and indispensable way (a sensible and affective way according to Hegel) of pursuing such a goal' (4). Note the subtle shift here, from films (or artworks in general) as indispensable qua philosophical works, to films (or artworks in general) as indispensable parts of a wider framework of human self-knowledge.

So my conclusion is twofold: Pippin has given us a rich and nuanced analysis of Hitchcock's sophisticated and subtle depiction of the struggle for mutual understanding and the perils of unknowingness in Vertigo. And it is no small achievement to say something fresh and compelling about a film as widely discussed and celebrated as this one. That the depiction deserves and can withstand a philosophical exposition, with all the self-consciousness and abstraction that that implies, is not in doubt. Whether that makes the film itself a work of philosophy, even in the qualified sense intended by Pippin, remains an open question.