The Philosophical Imagination: Selected Essays

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Richard Moran, The Philosophical Imagination: Selected Essays, Oxford University Press, 2017, 326pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190633776.

Reviewed by Daniel D. Hutto, University of Wollongong


Famously, Wittgenstein recommended that the preferred greeting between fellow philosophers should be 'Take your time'. The same advice applies to anyone who picks up this excellent volume of Moran's collected essays. There is a lot to digest here -- each and every essay delves deep. Moran takes his readers on a rare journey, with plenty of eye-opening twists and turns, in his explorations of the ideas of his carefully selected set of authors and topics.

The collection is divided and organized, largely topically, into three parts. The first part contains six essays on art and aesthetics -- examining such topics as our emotional engagement with fictions, and how we should understand these vis-à-vis the paradox of fiction and puzzles of imaginative resistance; the cognitive character and rhetorical power of metaphor; how to best characterize the normative demands of the beautiful; our inescapable expressivity, and its passive and active character, as revealed in film and photography; the self-defeating nature of certain acts of the will.

The second part contains five essays that aim primarily to explicate some of the main lines of thought of contemporary philosophers. These include chapters that look at: Cavell on the sort of scepticism that applies to other minds; Frankfurt on identification, on wholeheartedness, care and the reasons of love; Murdoch on existentialism -- and what we ought to preserve from it; Williams on philosophy as a humanistic discipline and the importance of the history of philosophy to its current practice.

The third, and final, part contains five essays (one of which is co-written with Martin Stone) focusing on agency and the first-person. It begins with a chapter criticizing "theory theory" for adopting a mistakenly third-personal and speculative conception of how we are situated with respect to our own actions and decisions. Such an approach, Moran argues, unhelpfully conflates theoretical and deliberative activity. The next two chapters are devoted to reviewing Anscombe's powerful influence on contemporary philosophy of action and philosophy of mind, and how subtle misunderstandings of her work have led to confusion about the nature and special character of practical knowledge. The penultimate chapter examines how self-knowledge and rational agency are related. It focuses on questions of transparency -- of how it is possible to know some of our states of mind, such as the contents of our beliefs, by inquiring about the state of the world. Moran argues that this kind of transparency is only possible because we play an active role in determining the content of world-focused states of mind. Yet he also warns against understanding the active role that we play when making up our mind in such cases in terms of voluntarism about belief. The final chapter takes up a related theme and looks carefully at how our self-understanding connects with our capacity to narrate our lives. The topic is of special interest in light of the fact that individuals are not just subjects of the stories of their lives but have a special authority when it comes to authoring those stories.

It is impossible to show how Moran's chapters enrich our understanding of the many and various topics under scrutiny without going into details. To fully appreciate the illuminating analyses and correctives Moran provides requires more than becoming acquainted with a broad survey of his summary conclusions; one needs to follow the intricate steps through which he reaches those conclusions. Nevertheless, it is possible to get a sense of the importance of this volume, as well as a flavour for what its chapters have to offer, by focusing on a few highlighted examples -- those that bring to the fore some major themes that are repeated in the essays and which lend unity to the collection. These include issues about the passive and active dimensions of self-expression; the need to make room for a conception of self and rational agency that cannot be captured from a purely third-personal perspective; the need to de-intellectualize our understanding of certain phenomena and, everywhere, to resist the will, and the rush, to theorize before we obtain a descriptively adequate grasp of the phenomena under scrutiny.

An illustrative example of Moran's overall approach can be found in the way he attempts to demystify what is involved in our emotional engagements with fictions. He relieves us from having to think about what this involves by appealing only to standard philosophical depictions of what goes on in such cases -- depictions that make such engagements seem either irrational or impossible. Part of this demystification involves coming to see that the resistance we encounter when we are asked to imagine certain aesthetic or moral possibilities, reveals that there are some forms of imagining that cannot be subsumed within the category of purely intellectual -- hypothetical or suppositional -- forms of imagining: namely those that only imagine what is fictionally true about some possible situation or scenario.

Imaginative resistance arises when we refuse to imagine something that is morally or aesthetically repugnant to us, something that breaks with our background and accustomed ways of thinking. The fact that we sometimes encounter imaginative resistance when engaging with fictions suggests that the imagining those encounters involve cannot be of a purely intellectual sort but must be rooted in a full-bodied, emotionally hot kind of imaginative activity. Put otherwise, imaginative resistance appears to be sponsored by something other than cold supposition.

Plausibly, to understand such non-propositional forms of imagining we must focus, not only on the content of the fiction in question, but on the manner in which that content is presented. In general, Moran seeks to take the sting out of the philosophical puzzles apparently thrown up by our engagement with fictions by stressing the psychological power of the non-mimetic qualities of artworks. He reminds us, through crucial comparisons, that the ways we are moved by the expressive features of artworks are similar to the ways we are moved by the expressive features of others in our imaginative engagements with them. Ordinary cases of empathy, for example, qualify as involving the imagination too since they are cases in which we are sensitive to non-actual possibilities. Moran highlights this feature when considering the sort of reactions that typify spontaneous empathetic reactions such as "wincing and jerking your hand back when someone else nearby slices into his hand, even though you know you are in no danger of cutting yours" (p. 5). Crucially, reflection on this type of case reminds us of something that carries over into our dealings with fictions for "in seeing someone else attacked, I may be well aware that I am in no danger myself. I am not at the moment confusing myself with the other, and yet I am wincing as if in pain, recoiling from a threat, filled with fear and horror" (p. 7).

Other essays pick up the de-intellectualizing theme as well. Resisting intellectualizing tendencies again becomes necessary if we are to strike the right balance when trying to properly characterize the cognitive status of metaphors. Metaphors confound because in some sense they appear to 'communicate' and 'convey ideas' and yet they function in ways similar to images or have framing effects that cannot be rightly characterized as content-bearing in the familiar sense. As Moran reveals, this means we need to come to terms with how we can understand or misunderstand metaphors without falling into the trap of thinking that metaphors make cognitive contributions in virtue of their possessing content of the sort associated with assertion or belief.

In advancing this line, Moran resists the temptation to advance the unilluminating claim that metaphors are meaningful in their own special way. Rather, he recognizes that metaphors depend on our interpretation of a speaker's beliefs. And this is so despite the fact that metaphors are best understood in terms of changes to habits of attention that cannot be understood directly in terms of accepting or rejecting certain believed contents. Given this, Moran concludes that even though metaphors lack the cognitive properties had by other content-bearing states and attitudes there is nothing to be gained by relegating metaphors "to the category of the noncognitive" (p. 38).

Trying to make sense of cognitive phenomena that do not fall within the canonical category of content-laden assertions, judgements and beliefs can be tricky. Crucially, it requires recognition of a special kind of normativity -- one that makes room for answerability to objective features of the world, even though the kind of answerability in question is not of the same sort that we find in claim-making activity. That there are such special kinds of norms is a theme that arises in several places in Moran's essays: it is especially prominent in his discussion of different treatments of beauty by Kant and Proust and, again, in his examination of Frankfurt's account of the ways that love and care are fundamental attitudes that play a role in motivating us and grounding our reasons.

To understand the kind of normativity that such attitudes exhibit, Moran argues, we must get beyond the familiar philosophical penchant for over-intellectualizing any phenomena under scrutiny. Taking loving and caring as exemplars, we must understand them as "essentially active responses to something else, and answerable to the specific norms of that something else" (p. 153). Such norms are perfectly objective. Making a comparison with norms of pleasure, for example, Moran explicates this point by reminding us that "idly stroking some surface will determine that only some activities and only some surfaces will be possible providers of just those pleasures" (p. 153). Hence, there are conditions of satisfaction for such norm-guided activity but, crucially, those conditions need not be contentfully represented, as an intellectualized treatment of such phenomena would have it. Moran defends this kind of anti-intellectualism by reminding us that even though they exhibit their own brand of normativity, "None of this is to say that all these different types of response should be seen as simply forms of judgements" (p. 153).

Another place where we must expand our philosophical imaginations is in thinking about the kind of authority and self-knowledge that we have with respect to what we do and why we do it. There is a widespread tendency to think that such self-knowledge does not differ from the kind of knowledge we have of what others do and their reasons for doing what they do -- namely, there is a tendency to think of all such knowledge as essentially theoretical in nature. Moran gives reasons for resisting this tendency in many of the essays.

Understanding a person's reasons for action cannot be achieved in the same way that we come by knowledge of impersonal objects and their properties. When it comes to knowing what another is doing or their reason for doing it, we have no choice but to consult the person in question. Drawing on Cavellian insights about what separates knowledge of objects and knowledge of persons, Moran defends the view that persons always have a say in how we understand them:

the tomato, the planet and the proton don't have a view on how they are described; there is no issue there for our best theories of these things leaving out some aspect of their existence that matters terribly to them; and our explanations of their behavior do not wait upon their acknowledgement that, 'yes, this must be what I've been doing all along.' (p. 134)

Persons, unlike purely physical objects, "have some say in the matter as to what shall count as being known and being understood" (p. 135, emphasis added). This is why deciding what a person is doing and why cannot be known or discovered 'from the outside' -- by means of, say, purely impersonal theorizing. People have a degree of privileged authority in saying what they are doing and why -- 'from the inside' -- they have a practical knowledge of their actions and reasons that does not reduce to speculative, theoretical knowledge. Moran explores how best to understand Anscombe's views on these matters in great detail in the essays in the final part. His efforts pay dividends. For example, Moran reveals why Anscombe was so centrally concerned with the expression of intentions and why she thought such expressions need to be understood along a spectrum that mirrors the progressively unfolding nature of actions themselves.

In his concluding essay, Moran explores the links between our narrative practices and this kind of self-understanding. He argues convincingly that having the capacity to give an account of what one is doing and why, with special authority, neither entails nor need be explained by being able to implicitly narrativize one's life or to experience it narratively. He emphasizes that such psychologising explanations, which have been attractive to some in the phenomenological and existentialist traditions, are unnecessary. Taking an important leaf out of Anscombe's book, he reminds us that: a person can know "what he is doing, and knows this in virtue of doing it intentionally, and he could tell someone this if he were asked, but not because of any thoughts he is having at the time" (p. 309).

We are reminded of a good reason to avoid psychologistic renderings of the role narrative can play in our self-understanding by considering the tragic situation of Oedipus Rex. Though the story of Oedipus is in one clear sense his story, he was not always in a position to know all, or even most, of its important details. Indeed, there is a clear sense in which Oedipus's "story does not belong to him" (p. 314). He does not own his story or have authority over it the way that he might own or have authority over a personal belonging or possession. This is obvious enough when we consider, as Moran points out, that "any person's story contains the stories of other people as well" (p. 314).

Refreshingly, Moran does not seek to solve every puzzle concerning the various topics he investigates. He does not pretend to offer more answers or insights than he is able to supply. Throughout the pages of this collection, one repeatedly witnesses a willingness to draw attention to the complexities of the phenomena of interest, and in many cases, to rest content in having done so. As such, it is not unusual to find the following sort of comment popping up now and again: "I cannot claim to be doing more than pointing to the place where I think we need some such notion" (p. 275).

Apart from touching on the aforementioned unifying themes, there is something else that unites these collected essays. A great many of them achieve their insights by attending to the illuminating subtleties in the writings of great philosophical figures such as Anscombe, Cavell, Davidson, Kant and Proust. For Moran, this historical, exegetical work is not confined to the mere recovery of the ideas of others, it is largely a matter of showing how an investigative revisiting of those ideas can correct the imaginative limitations of current thinking. In Moran's hands engaging with the work of authors in the history of ideas it is often a matter of seeing further than these figures did themselves. Hence, his general approach vindicates and shows the value of a way of doing philosophy that has, sadly, become unfashionable in some quarters. His essays illustrate that using philosophical greats as a lens through which to conduct our philosophical investigations need not take the form of a backward-looking, empty appeal to authority.

The Philosophical Imagination takes us on a tour of some of the best thinking about many pivotal philosophical topics -- not only the imagination, but aesthetics, self-expression, self-knowledge and many more. Moran's rich and valuable philosophical reflections are not just about the philosophical imagination, they exhibit beautiful specimens of the philosophical imagination at work, showing what it looks like when it is best employed. More than that, there could hardly be a better way to spur on and improve one's own philosophical imagination than engaging with Moran's wonderfully crafted essays.