The Philosophical Structure of Historical Explanation

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Paul A. Roth, The Philosophical Structure of Historical Explanation, Northwestern University Press, 2020, 188pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780810140875.

Reviewed by John H. Zammito, Rice University


The bulk of Paul Roth's book, as its title would indicate, has to do with placing historical explanations under philosophical inspection, i.e., evaluating "the putative 'goodness' of [such] explanations." (6) The study offers a lot that is illuminating about the distinctive nature of historical explanation, pivoting on its ineluctably narrative structure, and yet we should hearken to Roth's acknowledgment in the end that he provided a philosophical gloss on what historical practice has all along credited. What philosophy appraises is whether this habit of using narratives to explain is to be tolerated or condemned. That uninvited disciplinary inquisition is assuredly of philosophy's own making, but Roth concedes "nothing in this book represents a proposal to reform historical practice." (xv) At most, he suggests, it might engender greater methodological self-consciousness.

The ideal audience of this work, then, turns out to be philosophers -- and, indeed, philosophers of science -- and the lapidary assertion, "History is a science" (145), makes science the crucial problem-term in this work, not history. Its central point is that more than fifty years ago Thomas Kuhn used history to overthrow the entire received understanding of science. Roth insists, in italicized words, that it is an "important, albeit still unacknowledged fact that Kuhn's great work effectively reverses the received order of epistemic authority." (18) That should have made the question of the goodness of historical explanation suddenly paramount for philosophy, since science -- as the epitome of our conventional conceptions of legitimate inquiry -- became utterly contingent on history. After Kuhn, the norms that philosophers impute to scientific practice cannot be free of historical determination, that is, of "some narrative or other that explain[s] its status." (98) Roth expresses a measure of professional impatience that philosophers have not understood this essential peripety and rushed to examine the goodness of such a historical claim. His project is to overcome this silence of the norms by exploring how Kuhn's essentially narrative explanation could have had the power that it has wielded, what made for its goodness. Kuhn made it clear that understanding science -- empirical knowledge in general -- needs historical explanation, i.e., the guidelines of normal science turn out to be artifacts of its historical situation, "indexed to a time and a set of like-minded practitioners." (107) Conversely, with Kuhn as his exemplary instance, Roth argues that historical explanation is a good form of empirical knowledge. The loop is essential to Roth's holistic and naturalistic account of good reasoning about how the world is. Thus, explicating historical explanation becomes part of a general account of empirical knowledge. That is its important philosophical relevance.

Roth begins with a plausible claim: histories trace "a developmental process that emerges only in retrospect." (20) Interest in novelty, development, and growth motivates historical knowing, and histories exist only as a very special sort of retrospective description of the peculiarities and particularities that humans endlessly exhibit. All that seems sensible to a practicing historian. Then Roth elaborates further: apart from our accounts, events cannot be shown to exist since they are not "of nature's making rather than ours." (30) An event emerges only because our interest calls it into being; not because it is some natural kind. Of course, what is true of event is true of all our categorization: "nature does not dictate any organizing scheme to us." (36) Every style of reasoning (to use Ian Hacking's phrase) constitutes the kinds of objects it reasons about, and, indeed, cannot operate without these recognized kinds. Yet a distinction persists within this pervasive nominalism between the indifferent kinds employed in the natural sciences and the interactive kinds typical of human accounts. Roth cites Hacking's key formulation: "In natural science our invention of categories does not 'really' change the way the world works . . . But in social phenomena we . . . 'make up people' in a stronger sense than we 'make up' the world." (38) Roth infers literally that we have "to 'make up' a past." (43) This is what he means by historical irrealism. Because the past has no form until given one by categories we impose, a plurality of pasts arises. More emphatically: "an eventful historical past exists only as a result of human theorizing. History becomes an artifact of a disciplined disciplinary imagination." (51)

In one sense, what counts as evidence in all forms of knowledge, including historical knowing, turns out to be a product of disciplinary practices. "Training, feedback, and group reinforcement anchor words to the world." (57) These just are generic features of empirical knowledge; the kinds of things in our world reflect "choices under descriptions current in the community in which we work and act and speak." (citing Hacking, 58) Yet, in another sense, the categories historians use to constitute the past "possess nothing that intrinsically stabilizes them . . . [so historical discourse manifests a] lack of those features that make for stable scientific knowledge." (44) Its norms are merely socially entrenched practices that get taken for metaphysical verities. Like Arthur Danto and Louis Mink, Roth affirms that "scientific events have a 'standard description' as what separates historical discourse from scientific discourse." (62) No theoretical recipe instructs historiography about how facts signify an event or what that event is. That falls entirely to the normative considerations of each individual historian. In contrast to natural science, historical explanation must be non-standardized. From this follows a stark narrative holism, which Roth dubs, after Mink, non-detachability: "the event to be explained, and the events used to explain it, turn out to be part and parcel of the narrative to which they belong." (19) And this leads to a third a crucial aspect of historical explanations: non-aggregativity. Since different narratives identify different events and different causal sequences, they cannot aggregate, so there can be no cumulation of historical knowing. Each construction of a historical narrative stands or falls as a whole narrative; one cannot build upon another.

The question that arises is, simply, can a historical narrative ever be wrong? Are there any limits? Roth gestures to a persistent fear that, absent a standard of evidence, nothing real remains to constrain interpretation But his rejoinder is to question the very questioning: there is "no good reason to believe history must conform to some external and authoritative conception of legitimate explanation. Here, his philosophical holism and naturalism undermine the very idea of a transcendent standard for rational evaluations, any timeless demarcation for scientific goodness, any normative realm (in logic, in ethics, or wherever) beyond current scientific practice. Naturalism insists philosophy can claim no special methods or resources. Instead, actual sciences create their own standards and account for their own achievements, and this is all the epistemology there can be.

Where does that leave Roth's account of historical practice and how it qualifies as empirical inquiry? That turns on the peculiar status of evidence in history. Roth cites from William Walsh: "historical conclusions must accord with the evidence, but evidence, too, is not something that is fixed, finished, and uncontroversial in its meaning and implications." (156, n 21) That means, according to Roth, that remains (traces of the past) can serve as evidence for something only under a description retrospectively constituted by the narrative. Narrative explanation just is (essentially) constitutive of the events and hence of the evidence. Consequently, appraisals of historical accounts "turn less on questions of fact than on framing." (xv) Roth rushes to reassure: "This does not make the history unscientific." (11) Since narrative structure constitutes its own explanandum, appraisal of historical narratives is a matter of comparisons of whole accounts, more akin to theory-appraisal than to fact-checking. Given the "low cost of developing a competing paradigm in history" (138), the result is multiple pasts. This is not just an epistemic point -- underdetermination -- but a metaphysical issue: irrealism. Only "sophisticated and informed historical practice . . . [not some] purely logical criterion, [remains] to separate fact from fiction." 147)

Roth's historicizing proposes to engulf epistemic goodness in the contingency of history and its transient communities of inquiry, all seeking retrospective footing for their ongoing endeavors. He takes the Kantian maxim that knowledge is constituted by the knower beyond the epistemic sense of underdetermination, or the theory-ladenness of facts or evidence, to the metaphysical level that all categories -- the indifferent kinds of the natural world and a fortiori the interactive kinds of human self-understanding -- are made, not found. At several junctures Roth gestures to the flux of experience to suggest that escaping from blooming, buzzing confusion is our act (artifice), not a matter of finding ourselves in whatever world there might be. Roth concurs with Hacking (and Foucault) that the human is even more distinctly artificial than the natural. If Hayden White, that paragon of narrative historical theory, talked of historical matters being as much made as found, for Roth they seem made all the way down.

Ironically, from the vantage of a practicing historian who has suddenly been granted club membership in science, it turns out that some sciences are more scientific than others. But, to carry the irony one step further, that only bites if "scientific" means anything beyond a historical convention. If we are all scientific, now, that seems to be because, after Kuhn, we are all historical, first and foremost. "The 'reality of the past' . . .  proves to be no more (or less) problematic than our account of any other aspect of reality." (48) This is the upshot of holism and naturalism. Empirical knowledge requires general beliefs about the world to salvage any order from the flux of experience. And yet Roth's brave new world seems to offer little purchase on what would make historical inquiry empirical. On his reading of that term, the empirical in fact disappears. He explains that, in methodological naturalism, empiricism makes sense only from within science. In Roth's holistic loop, "empiricism requires science to explicate that notion -- experience -- on which, in turn, to base confidence in science." (126) From within, empiricism retains unquestioned importance, but this is only because theories within a science accept a standardized sense of what should be taken as a fact. But the empirical disappears when competing theories determine what counts as evidence or can explain away any discordant evidence, which he takes to be preeminently the case in history. Accordingly, appeal to facts in contestations of historical accounts turns out to be nothing but historians (including myself) "thumping on the lectern or praising the standards practitioners embrace." (137)

Roth thinks he has done better. I think, on his own account, as a Kuhnian philosopher of history as empirical inquiry, he needs to take disciplinary constitution of standards, even for (colligated) events, more seriously. I find it difficult to understand how historical practice can remain an empirical inquiry once Roth's irrealism goes through. He says it does, but I would like to read more about how, retrospectively, historical events emerge abductively, as part of an inference to the best explanation. He gestures to disciplined disciplinary imagination and sophisticated historical practice, but he has not cashed these out. I think "standards practitioners embrace" is all Roth or any naturalist, among whom I include myself, have, and to praise them is simply to affirm this necessary actuality.