The Philosophy of Animal Minds

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Robert W. Lurz (ed.), The Philosophy of Animal Minds, Cambridge UP, 2009, 320pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521711814.

Reviewed by William Seager, University of Toronto, Scarborough



The problem of animal minds is an especially difficult and, for a philosophical issue, unusually practical version of the classic problem of other minds. The traditional problem seeks the ground for our knowledge that other people enjoy mental states. Typical responses invoke, in various respects and in different ways, the similarity between oneself and other human beings. Whatever success these replies may enjoy, animals suffer from being obviously less similar to us than are other humans. The result should be unsurprising. Over more than four hundred years, various influential philosophers have seriously maintained that animals do not possess minds. In the 17th century, Descartes famously argued that animals’ inability to use language made it ‘morally certain’ that they lacked minds. In the 20th century, Donald Davidson, using a different argument, echoed Descartes’s opinion that in the absence of language minds could not be attributed to animals (Davidson, however, restricted his claim to intentional mental states and glossed over the issue of consciousness).

However, due to the ‘cognitive revolution’ in psychology as well as sophisticated and detailed studies of animal behavior both in the wild and in captivity, skepticism about animal mentality has virtually disappeared. The volume under review expends very little of its three hundred or so pages defending the existence of animal minds. Only two of its fourteen papers address the issue directly and both support animal minds. The volume might have been better balanced if some animal mind skeptics had been included but its contents accurately reflect current views. Nonetheless, it will be useful to sketch out a map of the issues beginning with this foundational question: (1) do animals have minds or, which I take to be equivalent, do animals have mental states? A positive answer to this question leads to a division of topics: (2) do animals think? and (3) do animals feel? Question (3) should be taken broadly as including the general issue of whether animals are conscious.

The papers collected here predominantly discuss (2), and those papers that broach (3) tend to do so from viewpoints that link consciousness and thought. With regard to (2), the contributors again provide a unanimously positive answer. What remains at stake is the nature of animal thought and the degree to which it is similar to human thought. Although the papers in the collection seldom explicitly refer to each other they form a lively implicit debate with some hints of an emerging consensus about the nature of animal thought which I will attempt to bring out in the course of a brief examination of each paper.

The first paper, by Dale Jamieson, attacks and effectively demolishes Davidson’s argument that animals lack beliefs and by implication all intentional mental states. Although the argument is successful at undermining Davidson’s linguistically and verificationist-oriented premises about the nature of belief, Jamieson’s positive proposals are less successful. Once the bare fact of animal thought is accepted there remains a residual Davidsonian problem about the contents of animal thought. Jamieson’s worry is over the tension in what he takes to be the intuitively correct position which accepts that (1) animals think but (2) exactly what they think is not characterizable. Jamieson considers and rejects two possible views which he calls ‘wet eliminativism’ and ‘brute content’. The first claims that animals have states which are similar to human belief states — similar enough to count as beliefs but at the same time different enough to explain the intuitive attractiveness of (2). Brute content views assert that animals possess beliefs and hence there must be a fact of the matter about their content, but this content is inaccessible to us. Of course, these two positions are not really at odds with one another. About the former, Jamieson entertains the suggestion that whether an animal’s state counts as a belief depends upon a contextually determined degree of similarity to the corresponding human belief but against this view goes on to say that:

Something has gone badly wrong. Context may be powerful enough to affect how to specify a belief correctly … but it is not powerful enough to transform a non-belief state into a belief, or a non-believer into a believer (p. 25).

Given that context is powerful enough to transform a tall man into a short one, I am baffled by this argument. This is not to say that Jamieson is wrong. I doubt that there is any plausible sense according to which the word ‘believe’ is semantically vague. But Jamieson provides no evidence against the proposal at all.

Jamieson’s brute content option could be bundled with wet eliminativism if we make the basis of similarity comparison the content itself. On this view, animal thought content comes in forms which are more or less different than that of our own thoughts. Most importantly, animal thought content is radically non-linguistic whereas there is a strong prima facie case that human thought content is exactly given by expressions of natural language. But of course it is commonplace for there to be some divergence even within the human realm. Suppose Marie believes, as she would put it, that ‘la rivière est belle’. John, an English monoglot says he thinks the river is beautiful. Do they believe the same thing? Not quite, since ‘river’ and ‘rivière’ are not synonyms. But the difference is small enough to ignore in most contexts. It could also be true that, even though there is a huge gap between animal and human thought content, there are many contexts in which it is correct to characterize the animal as believing that, say, a squirrel is up the tree.

Ultimately, Jamieson argues that the best account of animal belief is ‘metaphysical interpretivist’. I label it thus because Jamieson holds that, on this view, ‘content … is the product of an interaction between an organism and an interpreter’ (p. 30). This is obviously circular unless there is a notion of the interpreter which does not appeal to content. I see no way that this is possible; an interpreter just is a thinking being wishing to correlate his or her content with that of some target entity. Perhaps Jamieson wishes to maintain that only animal content is interpretation dependent. Such a rupture in the notion of content would seem to make Jamieson’s view a version of wet eliminativism.

A less ambitious version of interpretivism (to which Jamieson also alludes) is one according to which the correct belief to ascribe to an animal in a certain context is that which makes the animal’s behavior most intelligible to us. This view also does not seem genuinely at odds with the other options. It is tempting to take the line that (a) animal thought content is quite different from human content but (b) animal content states can be graded by similarity to human content states, and © thought attributions to animals are practically, but not metaphysically, dependent upon interpretation.

I have spent so long discussing Jamieson’s paper because it really sets the stage for a great number of the papers in this volume, which grapple with the nature of animal thought content and its relation to human (especially linguistically characterized) thought content.

Eric Saidel’s paper is the other defense of the bare claim that animals think. It consists in a long and careful argument that many animals have the capacity to independently represent both goals and possible means to achieve them. Saidel summarizes his line of thought with these remarks:

[Animals] represented the goal and the means to achieve that goal distinctly. I think that we can truly say of these animals that they wanted to achieve their goals and that they had beliefs about how to do so (p. 50).

But it is not absolutely clear that independent representation of goal and means is either necessary or sufficient for possession of beliefs and desires. Interpretivists would question the necessity claim. More speculatively, it might be logically possible for a genuine representational system to represent goals and means in an entity that lacked mental states. In fact, my computer might count. When it needs to download source code it tries various sites, including checking its own repository and computers on the local network and then the internet until it finds the files it needs. Thus one can change the possible ‘goals’ (software package to download) independently of changing the means to achieve those goals (connect to various possible software repositories).

More important is the point that Saidel’s condition on the representational capacities of animals is a very weak constraint. It leaves open almost everything about what animal thought content is and the general nature of animal representational systems.

One can then view the following papers by Michael Rescorla, Michael Tetzlaff and Georges Rey, Peter Carruthers, Elisabeth Camp, the trio of Andrew McAninch, Grant Goodrich and Colin Allen, José Luis Bermúdez, and Joëlle Proust as a set of investigations into the question of how animal thought content is embodied within their cognitive systems and what is the best way to understand the nature of this content. Although the relationships between the papers are complex and indirect (they hardly ever refer to one another, although the editor steps in now and then with linking footnotes) there are certain themes and controversies that integrate them.

One of these is the issue of whether animal thought is based on a language-like representational system. Rescorla argues that there is no need to assume the existence of such a powerful underlying system. Instead, he claims that animal thought is based upon sets of map-like representations which are subject to Bayesian probabilistic analysis. His own example is the famous case of Chrysippus’s dog, who did not need to sniff the final path his quarry could have taken after failing to smell the quarry on the first two paths. Does this show that the dog can deploy the inference of disjunctive syllogism? Rescorla prefers to think the dog has three maps whose probability dynamically changes under the influence of new information; the map representing the third path goes to probability 1 after the dog fails to smell the quarry on the first two. Rescorla does a good job with some obvious objections, such as that linguistic-like representations sneak in the back door via the machinery of probabilistic analysis. Rescorla’s primary motivation seems to be something like Morgan’s canon as he says ‘many experimental results supposedly indicative of non-linguistic deduction [i.e. deduction by creatures who lack language] can be explained without citing logical reasoning or logically structured mental states’ (p. 70). This is an important challenge to the still widely held view that inferential cognition requires representations with the kind of compositional structure which only language-like systems can provide.

Tetzlaff and Rey defend the ‘classical, realist theory of cognition’ against its main rival ‘connectionism’ (p. 72). An intriguing feature of this book, however, is that despite a profound interest in the nature of animal cognition and fair controversy about it, the only mention of connectionism is in Tetzlaff and Rey’s paper. Many of the authors endorse some version of the cognitive map proposal and see themselves as denying that animal thought is language-like. Tetzlaff and Rey provide a fascinating analysis of honeybee cognition, doubtlessly making the case that honeybees are remarkably intelligent and capable of impressive feats of cognition. But nothing in their discussion makes it clear if they think map-like representational systems fall under the purview of the classical theory. Maps clearly have a kind of compositional structure, and support some degree of systematicity and productivity, but of a restricted sort. The classical tent may well be large enough to accept map-like representation even if it falls short of embodying the full set of productive, combinatorial properties of language.

Tetzlaff and Rey’s examples of honeybee navigation, foraging and classification would all appear to be amenable to the Bayesian map approach of Rescorla. This is all the more true when we bear in mind that the maps involved need not be restricted to spatial/geographic targets. One can imagine a map which represented all sorts of properties, including value and prospective usefulness of various kinds.

Carruthers continues the defense of honeybee cognition (invertebrates in general actually) against the claim that such creatures lack concepts (hence cannot be said to think) because they fail Evans’s ‘generality constraint’ (roughly, if S can think Fa and Gb then S must also be able to think Fb and Ga). Carruthers provides a nice discussion of the constraint, the exact meaning and consequences of which are far from clear. The most important feature of the argument is that restrictions on the generality constraint make it easier to see how map-like representational systems could underpin thought without possessing all the features of language. In fact, Carruthers tends towards the view that our ability to couch thought in explicitly linguistic form is what makes it appear that our own thought fulfills the generality constraint.

He also advances the extremely interesting claim that humans possess two forms of cognition, one of which we share with animals and which is the system plugged directly into sensory uptake and behavior control. The second form of cognition is a late accretion enabled by language acquisition. This allows human thought to ‘approximate to the strong generality constraint’ (p. 100) but its products turn out to be merely what Carruthers calls ‘faux thoughts’. The real work of cognition happens down below in the engine room of the first system. Of course, it is tempting to equate the first and basic cognitive system with the map-like representational systems already discussed. This would offer an exciting unification in cognition across the animal world up to and including human beings. Our vaunted logical abilities would then be seen as a linguistically enabled adjunct, crucially important, but not something which severs our fundamental cognitive abilities from those of the animal world.

So far, the idea that true thought requires a ‘language of thought’ which is anything like genuine natural languages has not fared well. The well known ethologists, Dorothy Cheney and Robert Seyfarth have championed this claim with respect to baboon cognition. Camp’s paper is a very thorough, strongly argued and convincing attack on the baboon language of thought hypothesis, and something of a defense of the map-like representational system approach as an alternative. Once again the general structure of the argument is that non-language-like representation will suffice to explain baboon abilities coupled with an invocation of Morgan’s canon. Camp ends with the reproof that theorists have ‘neglected alternative representational possibilities because they have too unreflectively subscribed to a dichotomy between imagistic and linguistic formats’ (p. 126). The point is well taken but in fact the present volume goes a long way towards correcting the imbalance.

McAninch, Goodrich and Allen continue Camp’s discussion of higher primate thought and communication (one wonders if there is a danger of conflation of these notions in some of this work) and, like Carruthers, seek to widen the notion of what counts as a concept so as to endorse the claim that primate thought is conceptual. They adopt the neo-expressivist framework of Dorit Bar-On, in which certain utterances, broadly construed so as to include animal cries and other signals, serve the dual role of expressing the mental state of the utterer and expressing a semantically evaluable proposition. They argue that the famous warning calls of vervet monkeys fall under this framework and sufficiently meet a set of sometimes rather obscure conditions required of conceptual thought: compositionality, cognitive significance (this demands flexible links between perceptual content and belief content), reference determinacy (a recognitional capacity enabling the thinker to interact with the referent of the conceptual content of some signal) and force independence (which decouples conceptual content from the state of the local environment, as when we entertain counterfactual suppositions).

Interesting evidence is presented that a variety of animal signals across a range of species meet these conditions, thus favoring the hypothesis that animal thought is genuinely conceptual. A natural worry is that as the conditions for being conceptual are relaxed the distinction between conceptual and non-conceptual content becomes increasingly obscure. This worry is intensified insofar as the notions of conceptual versus non-conceptual content are themselves very far from clear. For example, in defense of the conceptuality of animal thought, McAninch, Goodrich and Allen note that ‘there is … sufficient evidence that animal signals are not interpreted as isolated semantic units’ (p. 143). I don’t see why a defender of non-conceptual content is required to endorse such an isolation claim, and McAninch, Goodrich and Allen do not attempt any detailed characterization of non-conceptual content to bolster the point. In fact, without well delineated characterizations of both the conceptual and the non-conceptual it’s hard to see what is significant about the debate. Nonetheless, the evidence in favor of the power and flexibility of animal cognition remains impressive and fully justifies the claim that animals (at least some of them) really do think.

With the claim that animals can think in hand, the papers of Bermúdez, Proust and Rocco J. Gennaro turn to the question of whether animals are capable of ‘meta-cognition’. Unfortunately, this is another rather obscure and under-characterized notion.

Bermúdez is concerned with whether animals can be said to be mindreaders. Are they capable of thinking about the mental states of other creatures? Bermúdez very usefully distinguishes three distinct forms of meta-cognition. The first is simply behavioral sensitivity to the psychological states of other creatures which Bermúdez calls ‘minimal mindreading’. It seems clear that minimal mindreading can occur without any ability to think about or reason about the psychological states of others (the example of dogs’ rather surprising ability to almost instantly interpret human gestures is given). The second and third are both forms of ‘substantial mindreading’. The less demanding form is perceptual mindreading, which is the ability to represent the perceptual states of others and adjust behavior in light of these representations. More demanding of cognitive power is ‘propositional mindreading’ which is the representation and utilization in thought of the propositional attitudes of others. Bermúdez regards the latter as requiring what is essentially a theory of mind enabling the mindreaders to ascribe a full psychological profile to the target. This is necessary because of the well known underdetermination of belief and desire ascription by behavior.

Bermúdez regards perceptual mindreading as rather easy to come by because, he argues, there are frequently quite direct connections between current perception and action whereas the ‘holistic nature’ of propositional attitude psychology makes the belief+desire and action links indirect. Although I think this is overstated, it seems plausible for creatures that broadly share a perceptual and cognitive view of the world. Bermúdez concludes with a detailed and interesting argument that propositional attitude mindreading requires language-like representation, primarily because language is needed to specify the structure of propositional attitudes in a way that encodes their inferential relations. These latter are needed if behavior is to be predicted on the basis of some ascription of beliefs and desires. Bermúdez thinks this means that only humans are capable of propositional mindreading. However, his argument against the possibility that a ‘language of thought’ could be sophisticated enough to encode inferential structure is weak. It is based on the idea that whereas the language of thought is a sub-personal aspect of cognitive architecture, propositional mindreading requires conscious access to the representations of others’ propositional attitudes. It just is not clear why a sub-personal system could not suffice to generate behavior based upon the representation of both self and others’ propositional attitudes.

I also doubt that it is as clear as Bermúdez thinks that map-like representations could not model propositional attitudes. Bermúdez asks how there could be a map of a conditional. That might be a difficulty until one allows for systems of related maps, especially ones which are being dynamically assigned probabilities as discussed above.

Proust’s intriguing but difficult paper attempts to describe a non-linguistic mode of representation capable of supporting meta-cognition. It also has interesting, if unexplored, connections to the map-like representational systems advocated by many of the contributors to this volume. Her basic notion is that of a ‘feature based system of representation’ where features are very broadly construed environmental conditions regarded as subjectless. Typical examples of feature placing representations, the idea of which goes back at least to Peter Strawson’s book on individuals, would be: ‘food here now’, or ’it’s raining’. Perhaps one can think of this as like a multi-dimensional map which registers a host of salient environmental conditions centered on the perceiver, but not containing any representation of individuals. The behavior of creatures with such representational systems would be modeled as something like motions along gradients of features (which would presumably take on both negative and positive ‘tone’ depending on their relevance to the survival of the creature at issue). Proust likens the features represented to Gibson’s ‘affordances’. She then asks a very interesting question. Could some of the features be the mental states of other creatures or those of the subject itself? Maybe. Proust suggests that the familiar ‘tip of the tongue’ feeling could be a model of such a ‘mental affordance’, albeit an intra-subject one. While highly speculative, it seems possible that certain experiential states, which place features when viewed as perceptual states, could be keyed to the mental states of other creatures. It is an interesting question whether such mental feature placing could rise above Bermúdez’s perceptual mindreading and ground propositional attitude mindreading in the absence of language.

Gennaro defends a more traditional view of metacognition. Contrary to the various more liberal accounts within the volume, he takes metacognition explicitly to be the ability to think about mental states as such. His primary goal is to develop further his long-standing argument in favor of the dual claims that a form of the higher-order thought (HOT) theory of consciousness is correct and that a wide range of animals enjoy genuine conscious experience. Since the HOT theory requires the ability to conceptualize mental states, animals will have to have the necessary conceptual resources if they are to be conscious. What is interesting in this article is the argument that (some) animals may be able to think about their own thoughts without being able to think about the thoughts of other creatures. The theoretical appeal of such a claim is obvious insofar as it promises to allow a wider range of animals into the magic circle of consciousness. But it seems on the face of it rather odd that thinking could be restricted in this way. Technically, the proposal threatens to violate the generality constraint on concept possession. Gennaro spends some time arguing that the generality constraint is too strong in general and that there might be a special class of concepts which are targeted at the subject’s own mental states but which do not extend to those of others.

David DeGrazia goes yet further than Gennaro in the attribution of meta-cognition and, in particular, self-awareness to animals. For example, he believes that ‘most or all sentient animals have’ an awareness of ’one’s agency’ (p. 202) and is willing to posit the plausibility of the idea that rabbits, insofar as they feel hunger sensations also are aware of having those sensations. DeGrazia provides a range of suggestive empirical data (including that provided by his own dog) and relentlessly, and I would say rather tendentiously, provides them with a hyper-mentalistic interpretation.

In a somewhat iconoclastic paper, relative to the topics of the rest, Robert C. Roberts brings his own well developed theory of the emotions to the discussion and considers to what extent animals share with us the full range and sophistication of emotional response. He finds that animals are capable of quite sophisticated emotions but fail at certain crucial points to achieve the full range of emotion. For example, it is an interesting characteristic of human emotion that we can take a consciously resistive attitude towards emotional states (as in Plato’s famous example of Leontius both wanting and not wanting to look at the corpses). While at least some animals can resist emotions in the sense of having conflicted emotional drives it seems doubtful that any non-human animal can enter into a reflective state of evaluation of its own emotional response. With respect to one of the volume’s main questions: what is the nature of animal thought content, Roberts adds a distinctive and intriguing idea. He regards something he calls ‘situational awareness’ as an essential feature of emotions and argues, somewhat elusively, for the claim that this allows animal thought to be ‘conceptual and propositional’ in the absence of any language-like mode of representation. The idea is something like this: the grasp of the situation which emotion provides is evaluable in conceptual and propositional terms. This is akin to the weak form of non-conceptual content which is characterized in terms of the appropriateness of certain conceptual descriptions of states of creatures which themselves lack those concepts.

The final two papers of the volume, those of Elliott Sober and Simon Fitzpatrick, veer off in an entirely different and much more abstract direction. They address the methodological issues that plague the attribution of mental states to animals in the scientific context. Both authors are interested in the principle of parsimony and how it might relate to one’s choice amongst theories that attribute different ‘levels’ of thought to animals (e.g. does a theory attribute higher-order thoughts to animals or simply first-order thoughts). Sober deploys extremely sophisticated statistical techniques initially developed by Hirotsugu Akaike (much of the interest in the paper is Sober’s exposition of Akaike’s ‘model selection theory’). The upshot is that there are possible situations in which attributing higher order thought could be favored even if a theory which posits only first order thought fits the data equally well. This could happen if the ‘Akaike Information Criterion’, which in this sort of case boils down essentially to a measure of the number of independent parameters required to specify the theories at issue, favors the theory which deploys higher order thoughts. Satisfied with sketching the theoretical relations between parsimony, realism and instrumentalism, Sober does not take a stand on the question of what is the best account of animal minds.

Fitzpatrick’s paper is also devoted to methodology and the principle of parsimony. Fitzpatrick’s line is that, to oversimplify, there is no principle of parsimony. Theory choice motivated ostensibly by simplicity is really responding to some other definite theoretical virtue. These other virtues are contextually dependent on the particular theories and issues under consideration. Fitzpatrick calls this view ‘deflationary simplicity’. In the context of the attribution of various cognitive abilities to animals, in particular mindreading, Fitzpatrick emphasizes that the received plausibility of background theories about, as it might be, cognition in general or the ability of animals to recognize complex statistical patterns in mere behavior is what should guide theory choice. Simplicity as such is reduced to a kind of red herring, obscuring the kinds of evidence needed to decide questions about the power and range of animal cognition.

Overall, this is a highly stimulating collection of papers which considerably advances the philosophy of animal minds. It will be of interest both within the borders of philosophy of mind and in the rapidly expanding scientific disciplines involved with animal thought and feeling.