The Philosophy of Argument and Audience Reception

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Christopher W. Tindale, The Philosophy of Argument and Audience Reception, Cambridge University Press, 2015, 244pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107101111.

Reviewed by Gary Curtis, The Fallacy Files (


This book is a sequel of sorts, if not explicitly so, to Christopher W. Tindale’s earlier Rhetorical Argumentation. An acquaintance with the earlier work makes the current book easier to understand, and the previous book is easier to understand than the newer. For these reasons, I recommend starting with the first book and continuing to the second only if you find the former worthwhile.

The new book is not so much a monograph as a collection of essays loosely connected by its title subject. Since it is long and this is a short review, I will be able to make only a few specific comments together with some general observations. There is much in the book that may interest philosophers or scholars of rhetoric that I will have to pass over in silence.

While his academic background is in philosophy, Tindale takes a rhetorical perspective on argumentation, as is suggested by the title of his earlier book. It is perhaps surprising for a philosopher to take such a sympathetic attitude to rhetoric given the longstanding feud between the two disciplines. The rivalry between philosophy and rhetoric began at least with Plato, who was highly critical of the itinerant teachers of rhetoric known as sophists. Aristotle, who wrote the seminal work on rhetoric, is nearly as critical of the sophists as his mentor. As recent a philosopher as Quine wrote:

Rhetoric is the literary technology of persuasion, for good or ill. . . . Debating teams are promoted in schools as a spur to effective language and incisive thought. They serve that purpose, but only by setting the goal of persuasion above the goal of truth. The debater’s strength lies not in intellectual curiosity nor in amenability to rational persuasion by others, but in his skill in defending a preconception come what may. His is a nefarious knack of disregarding all the discrepancies while regarding every crepancy. (Quine, 1987, “Rhetoric”)

This is the usual philosophical critique of rhetoric expressed in Quine’s distinctive style. Despite such animadversions, I am on the side of rhetoric. Of course, as Quine explains, rhetoric can be used for evil as well as good, but this is true of any technology. The teacher of rhetoric is not necessarily to blame for its misuse by politicians, advertisers, and propagandists. As an analogy, consider logicians and teachers of critical thinking who name and explain logical fallacies. Some students may use such knowledge for the nefarious purposes described by Quine, but teachers are not to blame unless they encourage such misuse.

Turning now to the book, it lacks an introduction, but the first two chapters serve the purpose. In the first chapter, Tindale discusses the concept of argumentation and its importance. He contrasts an argument as an “isolated logic exercise” (p. 2) with an argument as a quarrel. In section 1.4, he introduces three general approaches to argumentation: logic, dialectic, and rhetoric. One difference between logic and dialectic, on the one hand, and rhetoric, on the other, is based on the three types of rhetorical “proof” identified by Aristotle (1356a):

  1. Logos is what we would ordinarily consider “proof”, that is, considerations that appeal to the reason.

  2. Ethos appeals to the character of the arguer and depends upon the audience’s trust in those whom it believes to be honest. Such appeals may seem out of place in rational argumentation, which is why argumentum ad verecundiam and ad hominem are traditional fallacies: the first appeals to character and the second attacks it.

  3. Pathos is an appeal to the emotions of the audience, which gives rise to a long list of fallacies appealing to most named emotions: argumentum ad invidiam, ad misericordiam, ad odium, and so on. Rhetoric differs from logic and dialectic by including ethos and pathos as modes of “proof”.

Chapter 2 begins by emphasizing the social nature of argumentation, which leads to the exaggerated claim that the audience is “co-author” (p. 22) of an argument. Of course, arguers are usually aware of their audience and attempt to tailor their arguments to it. However, it’s perfectly possible, and a familiar occurrence, for arguers to misunderstand their audience. So, far from being a co-author, it is the audience as imagined by the actual author that plays a role in argumentation. This means that much argumentation is less collaborative than Tindale claims. Moreover, the most collaborative type of argumentation is not rhetorical speech but rather the problem-solving exchange of dialectic, which may indeed produce conclusions that individual participants would not have arrived at on their own.

Chapters 3-5 discuss the role of audience in the works of three philosophers: Aristotle, Chaim Perelman, and Jürgen Habermas. In addition, Chapter 6 examines the semantic theories of Paul Grice and Robert Brandom. Philosophers interested in these thinkers may find one or more of these chapters the most rewarding in the book.

Chapter 7 concerns testimony, but its relation to the role of audience in argumentation is tenuous. As mentioned previously, ethos is considered a “proof” in rhetoric but, from a logical point of view, character is an irrelevancy that cannot affect the cogency of an argument. One way to reconcile rhetoric and logic on the role of ethos is to invoke the distinction between argument and testimony. Arguments must stand or fall on their own merits without help or hindrance from the character of the arguer, but testimony depends to a great extent on the credibility of the testifier. Thus, there is a role for appeals to character in the evaluation of testimony, but none in the evaluation of arguments. However, it’s difficult to see that the audience plays any more of a role in testimony than in argumentation.

Chapter 8 examines the important issue of the role of emotions in argumentation. As mentioned previously, this is a major difference between rhetorical argumentation and logic or dialectic. Tindale claims that emotions are rational (p. 160), but his support consists of pointing to the work of neurologists such as Antonio Damasio (1994) that appears to show that emotion is involved in practical decision-making. However, this does not support the conclusion that emotions are necessarily rational and, elsewhere in the same chapter, Tindale accepts that sometimes emotional argumentation can be fallacious (pp. 161-162). So, how can we tell whether a given appeal to emotion is fallacious? Tindale seems to accept as rational the appeal to hope in the speech that launched Barack Obama’s presidential campaign (p. 164) but labels fallacious an example from Benjamin Netanyahu that appears to have appealed to fear (p. 162). What makes the one emotional appeal rational and the other irrational? Is it the difference between hope and fear? Are not some appeals to fear rational and some hopes irrational? Unfortunately, the book supplies no answer.

The remaining chapters examine issues of personhood and agency (9), the rhetorical notion of “presence” (10), audience reception (11), and historical arguments — that is, arguments that are old enough that it is clear that we are not among the intended audience (12).

Given this book’s focus upon the audience for argumentation, a natural question is: what is its intended audience? From the book’s title and the fact that its author is a philosopher, one would suppose that the target audience consists of philosophers. However, I wonder whether I belong to that audience. I seldom found the book’s arguments persuasive and was left at the end wondering what its theory of argumentation is. Judged by the rhetorical standard of effectiveness, it failed to persuade me.

Given its emphasis upon rhetoric, one might think that the book’s audience includes those interested in rhetoric, speech, or communication. However, I think that those who are interested in practical rhetoric, such as formal debate, are not part of that target audience. I see very little if anything in the book that would be helpful to someone interested in winning debates or making persuasive speeches.

Additionally, one might suppose that logicians are included in the potential audience given that the title topic is argument. However, Tindale uses the words “argument” and “argumentation” in ways that differ from their logical meaning. In Rhetorical Argumentation, he cites a distinction between argument as product, process, and procedure (2004, pp. 7-8). The logician’s sense of “argument” is argument as a product, that is, a set of propositions produced by an arguer in the course of argumentation. Argument as process refers to the actions performed by an arguer that produce arguments as products. Finally, argument as procedure refers to the social practices and conventions that govern the process of argument. To the limited extent that logicians use the word “argumentation”, it would presumably refer to the process of making arguments as products. However, Tindale is critical of this sense of “argument”:

we have been used to defining an argument as a series of statements . . . at least one of which (the premise) provided support for another (the conclusion), and it has the goal of persuading an audience. Bringing the audience into the definition marks the engagement with rhetoric . . . But still there could be a tendency to separate out the “structural” part of the definition and treat arguments . . . as mere products. This effectively tears the product from the process in which it was produced and pins it down for review and assessment, like a butterfly on a display board — colorful, perhaps, but also lifeless. (p. 23)

Tindale seems to be chary about defining his terms, so that neither “argument” nor “argumentation” is explicitly defined. According to the index, the following is his definition of “argument”: “as a type of discourse an argument is both an organization and a dissemination, since it collects ideas and then moves them internally from premises to conclusion, and then externally to an audience.” (p. 24) That is not a definition and the index is wrong, you may think, and I agree that it is not a definition, but I have not found a better one in the book.

Based on his general approach and passing comments, Tindale seems to take a holistic approach to argumentation. One can see this most clearly in the above quote about arguments as dead butterflies, pinned down by logic. Thus, he appears to reject the analytical approach of breaking a complex problem down into simpler, more easily solved sub-problems. Instead, he is always seeking to add layers of complexity, such as considering the additional factor of the audience for argumentation. Now, there is something to be said for never losing sight of the big picture, and I would never suggest that we should simply ignore the audience factor. Indeed, from a logical point of view, the audience is indispensable for understanding enthymemes. However, if we must first understand the whole world before we can understand a single argument, then we will never understand anything.

How, if at all, does this book advance our understanding of rhetoric — that is, not rhetoric as a scholarly subject but rather the rhetoric we confront in our everyday lives? It begins on a hopeful note, with Tindale summarizing and commenting on three of President Barack Obama’s speeches. This suggests either that these speeches will be used as data or examples used in developing its theory, or revisited at the end of the book when that theory can be applied to them. Unfortunately, neither is the case, and the book is otherwise lacking a firm grounding in examples of real-life argumentation. One of the three speeches reappears in the middle of the book as an example of a figure of speech, but the other two are not mentioned again until the very end, and then only briefly.

While summarizing the speeches, Tindale makes many worthwhile comments about Obama’s rhetoric and figures of speech. However, in rhetorical terms, these are “commonplaces” — that is, anyone familiar with rhetorical ideas and terminology should be able to make these points. For instance, speakers should know their audiences, determine what the audience does and does not know, and shape their speech accordingly. However, we also know that modern audiences are often complex and heterogeneous, difficult to understand and complicated to address.

Tindale points to Obama’s famous repetition of the phrase “yes, we can” in his victory speech as an example of the figure of speech antistrophe. True enough, but what was Obama’s purpose in using it? To what extent, if any, did the repetition advance his purpose? How are we to judge whether a figure of speech is effective?

I mention this example because it is one raised by the book’s discussion of these speeches and also because Tindale is skeptical of the value of formal logic in understanding argumentation. Yet, it is a trivial result in logic that repeating a premise in an argument, repeating the argument itself, or repeating its conclusion, can have no effect upon the validity or soundness of the argument. David Hackett Fischer even suggested a fallacy of argumentum ad nauseum (1970, pp. 302-303) to classify the repetitive rhetoric of advertisers, propagandists, and politicians. I would not go that far because sheer repetition is not even an argument, let alone a fallacious one.

As previously mentioned, Tindale criticizes the “isolated logic exercise” but fails to consider where such exercises come from or the purpose that they serve. To use the rhetorical device of analogy, this is like suggesting the irrelevance of calculus to physics because of the unrealistic word problems found in elementary textbooks and classrooms. For pedagogical purposes, such problems are extracted from their context and abstracted from the complexities of real-life problems. Logicians have indeed tended in the past to neglect or ignore the problem of applying formal logic to informal argumentation, mistakenly thinking it either a trivial problem or someone else’s problem. Thankfully, that attitude is changing, but this is not the place to enter into the details.

In conclusion, I cannot recommend this book to analytic philosophers, logicians, or those interested in practical rhetoric or real-life argumentation. Members of the academic rhetoric community can no doubt judge for themselves whether it is likely to be of interest. Also, as mentioned at the beginning of this review, I would not recommend it to anyone who had not already read Rhetorical Argumentation.

To end on a positive note, the editing of this book is outstanding and a great relief after some prior unpleasant experiences with sloppily edited scholarly books. I have found only three typographical errors in the entire volume (pp. 55, 117n, 235), which may be some kind of record.


Antonio R. Damasio, 1994. Descartes’ Error: Emotion, Reason, and the Human Brain. New York: Grosset/Putnam.

David Hackett Fischer, 1970. Historians’ Fallacies: Toward a Logic of Historical Thought. New York: Harper.

W. V. Quine, 1987. Quiddities: An Intermittently Philosophical Dictionary. Cambridge: Belknap Press.

Christopher Tindale, 2004. Rhetorical Argumentation: Principles of Theory and Practice. Thousand Oaks: Sage.