The Philosophy of Art: The Question of Definition: From Hegel to Post-Dantian Theories

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Tiziana Andina, The Philosophy of Art: The Question of Definition: From Hegel to Post-Dantian Theories, Natalia Iacobelli (tr.), Bloomsbury, 2013, 190pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441140517.

Reviewed by Gabriel Lemkow, Fundació Universitària del Bages-Autonomous, University of Barcelona


As its title implies, this book attempts to provide a general overview of the ongoing debate about how we can define art. While in my view it is primarily an introductory approach to that debate, it can nevertheless be useful for specialists in this field, as it also provides fresh material for philosophical reflection on the nature of artworks.

In the first place, Andina's analysis of the debate over the artifactual condition of artworks may be useful for those attempting to clarify what George Dickie might have meant when he claimed that the Genus of artworks lies in their artifactuality. Andina focuses critically on Dickie's notion in order to present Randall Dipert's alternative conception (pp. 69-81), which is more sophisticated than Dickie's and allows for a more accurate distinction between natural objects, mere instruments (objects used for a particular purpose without being altered) and tools (i.e., artifacts: objects that are used with a purpose in mind and that are altered or modified so to better perform and communicate that purpose) (p.76). Yet, although Andina attempts to clarify the notion of artifactuality so as to better understand what an artwork qua artifact is, this doesn't mean that she endorses in toto Dipert's theory. In fact she argues that stressing the artifactual nature of art is insufficient to explain what an artwork might be (p. 133). Artworks, she reasons, are complex objects (or rather, in her view, complex artifacts) which, if we are to understand them, require our taking into account not only a consideration of their physical constituents but also of their relational properties. On the one hand there are those properties that are nowhere to be found within their physical elements but rather in the beholder's mind. On the other hand, there are those other properties that are produced by the internal relations between the constitutive elements of the work.

Such a reflection leads Andina to another interesting contribution, based on Meinong's ontological theory of the nature of non-existent objects and of objects of higher order (pp. 135-144). On the one hand she claims, following Meinong, that even though it is possible to argue that some objects don't exist (such as, let's say, unicorns or fairies), nevertheless it is possible to ascribe properties to them. For example, she argues that while the imaginary creature Grisu the Tiny Dragon might not exist, it would still be possible to claim that he can fly, that he is brave, and so on. On the other hand, Andina also claims that the existence of an artistic representation of Grisu (as for example in a painting), or for that matter, of any other artistic representation of a non-existent being, allows us to claim that such a being exists as a representation -- even though Grisu the Tiny Dragon might not exist as an actual living being.

The implications of artistically representing non-existent entities are important for Andina. Ultimately she wants to defend her claim, inspired by Meinong's ontology, that artworks as representations of real or imaginary things are objects of higher order (or superiora) that rest upon a more basic physical support called inferiora. As superiora, Andina argues, artworks are social objects with relational properties that depend for their existence upon other subjects being able to 'see' their particular properties qua artistic representations. She claims, however, that these properties differ from those corresponding to the materials (or inferiora) used for such representations. For example, the paint used for a particular depiction might have the property of being sticky, dense and colorful. The physical surface upon which the painting is done might be soft and plain, and so on. The result of the artist's work, however, might be completely different. The artist might have depicted Grisu the Tiny Dragon, a depiction in which the beholder will understand that there is a distinction between the properties of the materials used and the properties of the dragon. The beholder will be aware that Grisu is not sticky or dense, as the paint used to render it, or plain or soft as the canvas would be -- but have a clear understanding that the representation reveals how brave, fierce, the dragon is. In other words, Andina's claim is that when talking about artworks one should take into account that the superiora (the whole) cannot be reduced to the sum of the physical parts of which it is constituted (i.e., its inferiora), as the new entity of higher order possesses new properties that none of its inferiora possess (143). To ignore this, she claims in a Strawsonian manner, would be like attempting "to get to know someone by focusing exclusively on his or her body" (144).

Borrowing from Danto's representational theory, Andina asserts that artworks are something more than purely material artifacts with aesthetic properties. They are, she argues, semantic vehicles of meaning. Artworks are thus representational and as such have particular meanings inscribed upon their physical surfaces. In fact, she proposes, not only artworks but also persons and other human instruments are semantic vehicles of meaning as well, given that they also can carry different types of meanings with them. Persons are carriers of meaning, Andina claims, in so far as they carry with them thoughts or beliefs. Human instruments -- such as rivers designated to act as boundaries between countries -- are, she argues, carriers of meaning too. Thus, the last part of her book examines what would distinguish artworks qua semantic vehicles of meaning from other types of semantic vehicles. Her conclusion is that while some vehicles of meaning might bear some correspondence to the real world, artworks don't (147). A story such as "Pinocchio," for example, does not tell us how reality truly is, but may be valued for other aspects: its narrative, originality, characters, and so on.

Another aspect that distinguishes artworks from other vehicles of meanings, such as traffic signs, is that while such other vehicles usually attempt to provide a clear and distinctive meaning, artworks often provide multiple and complex meanings beyond their apparently clear surface. What distinguishes artworks from other vehicles of meaning, she claims, is that they are non-transparent (or not as transparent as other vehicles of meaning). In this sense she claims that for artworks the medium becomes central in providing new meanings that no longer bear a transparent correspondence to truth (pp. 164, 167, 176). Thus by Andina's ultimate definition

A work of art is "a social object, an artefact, that embodies a representation, in the form of an inscribed trace upon a medium that is not transparent." (p. 166)

While the book serves as a useful introduction to a thorny subject, Andina's particular approach raises a number of problems. One is that her analyses seem to me to fall short of thorough examinations of each of the authors whose work she surveys. More concerned with defending her own views about art than in understanding that body of antecedent thought, she often rushes to judgment: more detailed examinations of the authors she looks at would show that some of her evaluations were unnecessary or irrelevant. In her chapter on the institutional theories of art, for example, Andina insists upon the idea that Dickie supports the centrality of aesthetic appreciation in artworks (pp. 44, 46, 51, 66, 69, 70) and she rejects the relevance of aesthetic appreciation because, she claims, "At most, we might claim that Fountain exhibits aesthetic properties as any other ordinary object does" (p. 48). This, she asserts, would make it difficult for an artist to argue that this object (Fountain) would be in a more privileged position to be declared an artwork than any other non-artistic object. In taking this position, however, she fails to note that Dickie makes no claim for artworks as candidates of "aesthetic appreciation" but rather of "appreciation" in general (Dickie, 1974: 40-41). In fact Dickie would agree with Andina, in so far as he also acknowledges that this loose sense of "appreciation" allows us to consider that almost any object could be appreciated (Dickie, 1977: 199-200). In this case, Andina's lengthy objection to Dickie's notion of "appreciation" misses the target, and leaves her very little space to devote to other more fruitful criticisms of Dickie's theory. One wonders as well whether she is simply attempting to negate Dickie's theory or is taking aim at institutional theories in toto: she often claims that she is criticising the institutional theories of art while what she in fact does is to criticise only Dickie's theory (i.e., she never criticises other institutional theories such as T. J. Diffey's or Stephen Davies's). In this case she makes the same sort of misstep as Davies (1991) does: in his attempt to show that Monroe Beardsley's theory is wrong, he mistakenly believes that he has thereby demonstrated that aesthetic functionalisms in toto are wrong.

In addition to her analysis of Dickie's notion of appreciation, Andina also examines Dickie's notion of "artworld" and compares it with the notion of "tulip world" (i.e., the world of connoisseurs, collectors, speculators, etc. of tulips during the 17th century). She makes such comparison in an attempt to clarify what the artworld is and to what extent artworks are produced by the artworld or are independent of it. Now, while Andina's analysis of the notion of artworld is more accurate than certain other aspects of her analysis of Dickie, her heuristic comparison of the artworld to the "tulip world" is certainly open to dispute. Such a comparison assumes, first, that both worlds would share similar properties, and that their respective objects of interest (artworks and tulips) would also share analogous properties. Perhaps this could be so, in the sense that both tulips and artworks have admirers, that they are both bought and sold, that speculation can drive their prices, and that they can be collected and displayed for the general public to admire. But to my mind it is misleading to ignore the fact that while artworks are objects created by artists using several types of materials (natural or artificial), tulips are natural objects that, even if they might have been modified in the course of time by man, are nevertheless still categorically distinct from non-natural objects like artworks. This becomes relevant when Andina moves to defend the idea contra Dickie that neither artworks nor tulips arise from their respective worlds (the artworld and the tulip world); rather, she argues, the opposite is what occurs (p. 61). While it would be possible to argue this in the case of tulips qua biological entities that precede not only the speculative marketplace reality of the tulip world but the world of Homo sapiens itself, this would be hard to argue for artworks. Rather than compare the artworld to the tulip world, I would suggest that Andina could have posed a far fairer comparison to prove her point. She could have made a comparison, for example, between the artworld and the aeroplaneworld . She could then have considered whether these respective worlds of interest in particular human artifacts appeared significantly after the creation of their objects of interest (the artworks or the planes) or whether, as Dickie claims, the artworld (or, for that matter, the aeroplaneworld) could have appeared together with the first artworks (or planes), in a sort of circularly inflected manner, different from what occurred with the tulip world and tulips.

In fact, Andina's reflections concerning the tulip world are interesting as they do provide some striking historical background information about how speculation with tulips occurred, and how the tulip market appeared, grew and died. I think, however, that these reflections would have been clearer if they had been shorter for the sake of clarity. What we want, from the similarities between the artworld and the tulip world, is ultimately to better understand what the artworld actually is, and what artworks actually are. Yet Andina's pages of anecdotes about tulip speculation threaten to lead us off such path.

These objections noted, it should be said that Andina's book offers the reader a useful broad view of the most important thinkers and currents of thought in this field: contextualism, institutionalism, normalism, representationalism, etc. I think this book will be particularly useful to readers interested in Danto's theories, given that some aspects of Andina's own position on the definition of art bear the mark of Dantian theory. She stresses the idea, for example, that artworks are semantic vehicles of meaning; she argues that artworks cannot be reduced to their material constituents (or inferiora); she makes an analogy between art and language; and she also insists that to understand artworks one must see them in their historical context. I also consider Andina's treatment of Danto's ideas in his analytical philosophy of history and in his philosophy of mind particularly useful as these ideas are presented by her to help us clarify what an artwork is. Thus the book allows readers to approach Danto's theories from a different yet interesting perspective, one that adds dimensions to our understanding of art, and of Danto's work itself.

After examining other definitions of art, Andina proposes her own, adding new material to the ongoing discussion. To be sure, aspects of her definition, such as the ambiguity of the notion of "inscribed trace" or her insistence on the non-transparency of the artistic medium, are open to debate. These terms seem to be used more metaphorically than literally. They don't seem to apply literally in all arts (such as in the case of music or of dance, where the notions of "inscribed trace" or of the "non-transparency of the medium" hardly seem to apply unless these notions were considered in a metaphorical manner). They thus are vulnerable to claims of unclarity and inadequacy. Yet in adding her own view, Andina enriches the discussion and moves it further along. Her book is a welcome source of fresh and intriguing ideas for this already rich and interesting debate about definitions of art.


Davies, S., 1991, Definitions of Art, New York, Cornell University Press.

Dickie, G., 1974, Art and the Aesthetic, Ithaca & London, Cornell University Press.

Dickie, G., 1977, 'A Response to Cohen: The Actuality of Art', in Dickie, G. & Sclafani, R. J., 1977, Aesthetics, a Critical Anthology, New York, St. Martin's Press.