The Philosophy of Charles Travis: Language, Thought, and Perception

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John Collins and Tamara Dobler (eds.), The Philosophy of Charles Travis: Language, Thought, and Perception, Oxford University Press, 2018, 373pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198783916.

Reviewed by Reshef Agam-Segal, Virginia Military Institute


A famous philosopher once visited my school when I was studying for my MA. We hoped to get clarifications from him about his views. More realistic, our professor, Gilead Bar-Eli, told us: “You think you’ll get answers; you’re only going to get more philosophy.” Apart from its other virtues, this excellent collection manages to get ‘more philosophy’ out of Charles Travis — often illuminating, often thought-provoking.

This is not an introductory volume. It requires some familiarity with the issues and with Travis’s positions. It is a good collection primarily because of the quality and variety of the twelve contributions and Travis’s replies. The volume has four parts: “Thought”, “Language”, “Perception”, and Travis’s replies. (It would have been convenient if the replies followed the essays immediately.) I expect many will choose to read only a few essays, as collections are often treated. However, to get a fuller view of Travis’s philosophical commitments, e.g., the distinctions between logic and psychology and between the conceptual and non-conceptual  (which Travis’s replies help clarify) and the ways his philosophy maintains contact with the history of philosophy (as opposed to some current analytic philosophy), one would have to do more than read a few essays.

Travis’s philosophy is often misunderstood. It is hard to read. (Example: “What all of what was then to be understood to be being presumed so makes something now recognizable as to what we were, in fact, then speaking of in speaking of ‘whales’” (292). Travis actually apologizes for this particular sentence, and says the grammar is necessary.) The volume aims not to make Travis easier to read, or to spare the reader the work of getting though his arguments. Instead, the contributions helpfully correct misunderstandings of Travis’s views. To various degrees, they offer views sympathetic to Travis’s, though distances still remain. These, Travis’s replies are often instructive in identifying. The reader may sometimes wish (I did) that views less sympathetic to Travis’s were better represented. The upside: the relatively wide common ground between Travis and the contributors allows for deeper discussions about shared commitments, views, and interests.

There are typos, e.g., on pages 83, 102, 340, 348; the contents page is missing the page-numbers for all of Travis’s replies except one; and the index fails to mention, or contains incomplete references to, many thinkers: Anscombe, Burge, Diamond, Kant, Köhler, Kripke, Moore, Price, Ramsey, Putnam, Ryle, Strawson. These issues aside, the volume contains good philosophical work throughout. Let me review the essays.

In his reply to Putnam’s contribution (which begins Part I) Travis says that in constructions like “‘There is a goat in the garden’ is true iff there is a goat in the garden” we don’t yet have anything eligible to be true or false (282). This is reminiscent of Wittgenstein’s image of “someone saying ‘I do know how tall I am!’ and showing it by laying his hand on top of his head!” (1958, §279). Words are not obviously meaningful just because uttered. This awareness of the possibility of meaninglessness forms one commonality between Putnam’s externalism and Travis’s contextualism — other connections are investigated in Putnam’s paper and Travis’s reply. Putnam (elsewhere) emphasizes how the reasons for counting something as water, for instance, or a straight line in space, will be relative to, and lack a basis unless we examine, what the world allows; Travis, on his part, emphasizes how talking to a botanist investigating the natural color of leaves, for example, can falsify the assertion that certain green-painted leaves are green. Neither, on a certain reading, is putting forward a theory regarding how meaning is determined in general — which explains some misreadings of Travis that Putnam’s paper examines (Tom Donaldson and Ernie Lepore, Jerry Fodor and Lepore); both Putnam and Travis rather issue invitations to look in certain places — the world, the circumstances — failing to look in which could make the fact that certain expressions mean something, or fail to mean anything, look puzzling.

Similar concerns are closer to the surface in Marie McGinn’s contribution. One consequence of the rule-following paradox — McGinn’s focus — is to make our words appear “dead”: ‘How is normativity even possible, if anything we say is interpretable in multiple contrasting ways?’ The paradox looks at words as Descartes once looked at people, seeing mere ‘dead’ hats and coats. McGinn examines three theoretical solutions — Communitarianism, Naturalized-Platonism (supposedly supported by John McDowell), and Quietism — but they only make things worse. She presents Travis’ view as a path between communitarianism and naturalized-Platonism: The intention to mean something determinate exists, but what such intending consists in should not be understood in terms of having some mental item, but rather, for instance, by our ability to correct misunderstandings about what we meant. I’m not clear if McGinn regards this as another theoretical solution. One main concern in Travis’s reply is to clarify what sort of treatment the paradox requires. He mentions how in this discussion we move from questions about reasons to apply a particular concept to questions about “earn[ing] our right to regard anything as a reason for anything” (290), and rejects this as “not really a question at all,” which suggests that the problem for him is not the kind that requires a general theoretical treatment. Similarly, Travis defends McDowell by suggesting a charitable, non-theoretical, way to read him: indicating ways of looking at our practices non-reductively, i.e., as already alive, suggesting that what needs fixing is the attitude that leads into the paradox, into deadness — just as to see those hats and coats as people is not to see something different but to see differently. Travis leaves it open whether comparable charitableness is possible towards the communitarian and quietist.

Travis’s contribution is a rich criticism of Fodor’s Representational Theory of Mind (RTM), and a presentation of the “Frege picture,” offered as a cogent picture of the mind, as superior. One element in RTM that Travis criticizes is the idea that whenever we have a propositional attitude, e.g., a belief, there is in us a subcutaneously, physiologically identifiable, mental representation, with the content of that belief. This, according to RTM, is what it means for someone to have a belief — “to stand believingly towards a certain thought” (56). Travis argues that the idea is unstable; not so much false as a non-starter. For one thing, such mental representations would be like sentences in a language, upon which content can be conferred. Now, sentences can have the same content as other sentences — express the same thought. By extension this goes too for Fodorian mental representations. Yet the criterion for such sameness of content cannot lie in the sentences or mental representations themselves; that two sentences or mental representations express the same thought is not for the sentences or representations to decide, which undermines the notion that we can identify beliefs — generally, an attitude towards a thought — physiologically. In a similar vein, Travis argues, regarding necessity: “There is rational compulsion; and there is causal compulsion. To be able to be under rational compulsion to think such-and-such is, in some sense, to be free of causal compulsion to do so” (88). In general, although he doesn’t put it this way, Travis’ arguments amount to accusing Fodor of holding on to a myth in Wittgenstein’s sense — e.g., to a notion of how content may be fixed, without due attention to what fixing content actually involves. Travis connects this to failure to heed Frege’s distinctions between concept and object and between the logical and the psychological.

Opening Part II “Language”, Oskari Kuusela poses a central question: What is the point of a theory of meaning? Kuusela contrasts Michael Dummett’s account with Wittgenstein’s and Travis’s. Wittgenstein, Kuusela says, rejects the “assumption of uniformity which determines what can be regarded as relevant for meaning in particular cases even before those cases are examined” (109). The point, I think, can be got at this way: Meaning is something we sometimes need to explain ‘naively,’ not philosophically, e.g., when there is ambiguity or another unclarity. For Wittgenstein, the point of a theory of meaning (if ‘theory’ is the right term) — i.e., what a general answer to the question “What is relevant for determining meaning?” gives us — is tied to the activities of ‘naïve,’ non-philosophical — ‘parochial’ in Travis’ sense — meaning-explanations. General accounts may have a point in the context of naïve parochial unclarities about meaning. Such unclarities are a life-force behind the general account. It is unclear, however, what such accounts’ point would be outside such contexts. Outside such contexts they’ll be dead. Or, at least, what general accounts are asking for — what would be a successful theory, now a theory in Dummett’s sense — becomes, outside such contexts, very obscure.

In his reply, Travis criticizes views that are kin to the views Kuusela criticizes. In what seems like a partial misreading, he seems to think Kuusela is presenting such a view himself. There is nevertheless tension between Travis and Kuusela. Travis takes his own point about the parochiality of meaning-explanation to be a point about semantics; Kuusela seems to think Travis’ point becomes interesting and important when we see how it affects our conception of logic itself. On Wittgenstein’s conception, Kuusela thinks, logic itself is parochial in something like Travis’s sense, and he sees this in Travis too. Travis himself, however, seems more suspicious. He does not deny logic might be parochial, but insists on keeping the points about the parochiality of semantics and that of logic separate; for him this is required by Frege’s insistence to keep psychology separated from logic. Running the points together, or even connecting them as Kuusela does, courts psychologism, from which Kuusela wants to explain how Wittgenstein escapes. Relatedly, Travis accuses Kuusela of “running things together: the extensions of concepts, the possible uses of language, the logical rules that govern it” (298): blending semantics, pragmatics, and logic — distinctions Kuusela questions exactly as part of his treatment of psychologism (but see also Travis’s distinction between two senses of “semantics” 334-5).

Nat Hansen focuses on Travis-examples, demonstrating occasion-sensitivity: how the same sentence, e.g., “There is milk in the fridge,” can be true or false in the same factual circumstances on different occasions: when there is a puddle of milk in the fridge, and on one occasion someone needs milk for their coffee while on another they were supposed to clean the fridge. The examples will only work, Hansen argues, to the extent that we judge similarly about what is in fact true. But, Hansen argues, even in the example above, our judgments may be skewed by the gloss the philosopher offers — much as an experimenter’s expectations can influence the subjects’ reactions; without such a gloss our judgments may diverge. Hansen summarizes results of experiments that show how. I’m unsure how seriously Hansen takes Travis’ notion of “occasion-sensitivity.” In his reply, Travis repeatedly calls attention to the “actual use of words”: actual events in which words are uttered and meant — not only to factual circumstances, but also to speakers, their intentions and purposes. This entire whole is the occasion to which meaning is sensitive. So, for instance, often, when we don’t understand a sentence, it has a speaker whom we can ask. Such a speaker is conspicuously absent from Hansen’s experiments. Travis denies he is offering a theory of a certain sort (308). Instead, he is directing attention in certain directions, reminding us where, in actual circumstances, we look to fix meaning; for in daily occasions we already know — as if, while philosophizing, we forget. Travis warns against staring at the words themselves, “There is milk in the fridge,” trying to extract their meaning and determine their truth value by inspecting factual circumstances. Certain pseudo-questions will seem urgent if we do (321). For this last point, Travis often draws on Thompson Clarke; the idea can already be found in Wittgenstein and J. L. Austin. I find it nevertheless interesting that Travis’ philosophy (arguably, like McDowell’s) creates such a strong expectation that he offers a theory. This makes it more difficult to understand sometimes, but on the other hand, it brings into the discussion philosophers who would not come otherwise.

Alex Davies defends occasion-sensitivity against the view that the content of what we say is fully determined by conventional properties of our words — roughly, by what formal semantics studies, the “meaning” of our words, understood as what determines content in context; specifically against David Kaplan’s view. Davies argues that our words have practico-normative properties as well. Roughly, he recommends a view of language as a means to achieve certain ends in circumstances, and argues that in given circumstances, and given the speaker’s ends — neither are conventional — “there are ways the speaker ought to be using her words . . . and anyone (suitably equipped) could see that that was so who was able to witness the speaking episode and its circumstances” (147). This, much as one has to use a rudder in certain ways if their destination is the Isle of Wight, and as anyone who knows the circumstances and enough about rowing would be able to judge. Davies reacts to the worry, Kaplan’s and others’, that we would be unable to communicate with language if the content of what we say was not conventionally determined. That worry reflects a pre-conception, a myth in Wittgenstein’s sense, fixating the direction of our philosophical attention and inhibiting our looking at how, in actual cases, content is determined. I nevertheless find some danger in Davies’s discussion; it may positively promote what is potentially another myth: a view of the listener as trying out hypotheses for interpreting the speaker. It is questionable whether this could realistically capture the variety of possible relationships and practico-normative contexts involving speakers and listeners.

John Collins’ contribution concerns language acquisition and Travis’s position vis-à-vis generative linguistics. One among several things he questions is Travis’s claim that there is an anti-empiricist, anti-behaviorist alliance between Noam Chomsky and McDowell: indeed, both reject what Travis calls ‘The Martian Principle,’ according to which any thinker is answerable, in principle, to what any other thinker is; but, Collins argues, McDowell’s way of rejecting the principle takes us back to a form of scientism from which it tries to escape: “McDowell simply assumes the underlying facts of our special design [in Travis’s terms, psychological equipment that enables language acquisition] to be irrelevant or somehow already settled” (169). Travis, replying, points out that the rejection of behaviorism for McDowell (with whom Travis sides on this) “does not await the outcome” of investigating what equips us to acquire language — mechanisms, designs. Although Collins entertains the possibility that for McDowell the details are irrelevant, it does not seem that he sees how this can be: how McDowell’s question is different than his: how asking what it even means to acquire language is prior to asking how language is acquired — by means of which psychological mechanisms.

François Recanati’s contribution is a defense of ordinary language philosophy against the disciples of ideal language philosophy. Ordinary language philosophy holds that there is no room for a distinction between semantics and pragmatics, of the kind ideal language philosophers think there is. This connects to contextualism, which considers much of what often gets relegated to pragmatics to be part of what determines the truth-conditions of a sentence, and thus as belonging to semantics. As a case in point, Recanati defends Keith Donnellan’s view regarding referential expressions: The semantics of what is said using a referential expression depends upon the referential act in context. In response, Kripke suggested a distinction between semantic reference, which properly belongs to semantics, and speaker reference, which is a mere pragmatic matter. But, Recanati says, Donnellan in effect denies there is such a thing as semantic reference. What an expression semantically denotes by itself does not generate any reference. Reference, Recanati says, requires a “mental act” (191), some epistemic relation of acquaintance between speaker and object, and an actual act of meaning by the speaker. Thus, “Donnellan . . . is best construed as a contextualist” (188). Still, Recanati thinks, Donnellan’s view has trouble with cases where what the speaker means by using a referential expression is not what the expression denotes. Recanati, to save Donnellan’s view, suggests we embed Kripke’s distinction in it: in such cases, apart from denotation, the expression has ‘mere speaker’s reference,’ but no semantic reference. One point Travis objects to in his reply is the idea that reference requires a “mental act.” This, Travis thinks, fails to heed Frege’s distinction between logic and psychology. Reference is not generated by a mental act of meaning: wanting to mean something by one’s words, even if in some context these words can be so meant, does not guarantee they will. If Sid is hot and dry and wants beer, and if there is nothing but an old and stale glass of beer in the larder, Pia’s telling him “There is beer in the larder” would not usually mean that there is an old and stale glass of beer in the larder, even if she honestly wants to mean that. Someone who thinks otherwise, says Travis, “would make a strange conversation partner indeed” (336).

Against a large orthodoxy, Travis argues (“The Silence of the Senses” 2013) that perceptual experience has no representational content. Keith A. Wilson (Part III, Perception) reviews the discussion that ensued, corrects several misunderstandings of Travis’s argument from looks, as well as replies to several objections. Wilson focuses on two commitments that representationalists tend to endorse: (1) perceptual experience has face-value — determinate content. (2) the content of perceptual experience is available to the perceiver for reasoning. Travis’s claim is that perceptual experience is in an important sense indeterminate, equivocal, and therefore makes no determinate content available for reasoning: “A particular case does not itself demand to be thought of in any particular way” (339). A tomato does not demand to be thought of as ‘a red object’ or ‘an edible’ or ‘the tomato I’ve been looking for’ or even as ‘a tomato.’ In his reply, Travis puts the discussion in historical perspective, and connects it to Frege’s warning to remember the categorical distinction between objects and concepts — the particular and the general. Specifically with regard to perception, “though one can watch the sun setting, one cannot watch that the sun is setting. Nor can one even catch a glimpse of it” (340). Represenationalism, Travis thinks, is largely a result of not heeding Frege’s warning. One important distinction Wilson highlights is between two questions: (1) what determines, individuates, representational content? and (2) what makes such content recognizable and available for reasoning? He credits Travis with the emphasis on the latter. Wilson does not discuss the connection between the questions, but it can be argued that part of the point of Travis’ talking about the epistemology of perception, availability, is to shift our attention to the way content really is determined, putting perception in its (also epistemic) context: to see how content is determined, how logic is brought on board, we need to remember that we experience in context.

Lastly, Mark Eli Kalderon defends disjunctivism  (long defended by Travis) and experiential pluralism: the view that seeing and hallucination do not share a common nature. Drawing on Aristotle, Kalderon argues that seeing is an exercise of a capacity — sight. Drawing on contemporary metaphysics, he argues that although seeing modally-existentially depends on sight — the exercise depends on the capacity for it (one sees only if one can see) — sight ontologically depends on seeing: to possess the capacity for seeing depends on what it is to undergo seeing-experiences. More specifically, sight ontologically depends on its non-defective exercises, on seeing rather than hallucinating: for seeing is what sight is for. This end, seeing, depends on there being something to see; seeing affords awareness of the natural environment. This shows that even if seeing and hallucination both draw on the capacity for sight, they nevertheless do not share a common nature. What leads experiential monists to the opposite view, Kalderon suggests, is the notion that we can determine a subject’s perception merely by the end-state of her perceptual system when it had been altered by visual stimulation. However, as the considerations above show, whether someone sees is rather determined by whether she has awareness of the natural environment, as per the point of having the relevant capacity. In his reply, Travis marks the ways in which Kalderon’s metaphysical arguments are grammatical: “Kalderon, as he presents himself, is engaged in good old, as well as some thoroughly modern, metaphysics. As I prefer to see it he is concerned with good grammar, or, if you prefer, with conceptual structures” (354). Travis thus echoes Wittgenstein’s remark that “Grammar tells what kind of object anything is” (Wittgenstein 1958, §373), and puts Kalderon’s argument in a larger philosophical debate, going back to Quine, about the primacy of grammar over science.

Guy Longworth examines the debate between Travis and McDowell about whether perceptual experience underwrites the acquisition of propositional knowledge by availing us with such knowledge. Travis emphasizes that the debate for him is about the nature of thought and truth. Longworth looks at this debate via an older debate between Austin and P. F. Strawson. Austin is close to Travis: Although what we see, “concreta,” put us in a position to determine truth, to judge, concreta themselves are not given propositionally; do not determine truth. If they did, Travis emphasizes, “the whole phenomenon of judgment (and of thought) would simply be abolished” (356). Longworth focuses on a defense of the Austin-Travis positon, and does not explore the Kantian motivations behind McDowell’s.

As a result, I believe, we don’t get a full picture of the debate. I believe there is miscommunication between McDowell and Travis. Underneath their disagreement, they are asking different questions. Roughly, McDowell asks: What must experience be like for judgment to draw on it? Specifically, how are sensory experiences enlivened, given they are not mere ‘givens,’ dead Humean ‘bundles of perceptions,’ waiting for us to conceptualize, interpret, enliven? McDowell formulates his conceptualism in response to this question; but it is not Travis’s. Travis asks roughly: Of what can we say that we experience it if judgment is then to be about it? As a result, when identifying what we see, Travis typically adopts an objective, third-personal, ‘external,’ purely extensional, perspective, and talks of ‘objects in’, or ‘features of,’ ‘the shared environment’: for Travis, we see concrete things in the world, which we may then conceptualize. Travis therefore does not succumb to ‘the myth of the given,’ pace McDowell’s accusations, but that’s because McDowell’s Kantian question is simply not his. He is not interested in what we have in our experience when we see, but in what we see, and its non-conceptual status. Travis therefore does not take a perspective internal to experience, so to speak, as McDowell has to, to ask how things present themselves in perception, how we perceptually relate to what we experience, and what allows our experiences to be alive as they are. This, of course, is not to endorse McDowell’s answers. (For an illuminating discussion see Baz, forthcoming).

Finally, Michael O’Sullivan argues against the thought that aspect-perception, e.g., seeing the duck in Joseph Jastrow’s duck-rabbit, reveals that perception in general involves predication and is representational, and thus for a view close to Travis’. The rare cases of aspect-perception, O’Sullivan argues, indeed determine universals, and “occasion the actual making of judgments” (267) — which is not to say it is the experience of concepts, universals (for a contrasting view, see Agam-Segal, forthcoming). But this is not the case with the more common cases of non-aspect-perception that may ground judgment but are importantly indeterminate. Despite this proximity to Travis’ views, O’Sullivan’s discussion is, at least partly, about the experience of aspects, i.e., not only about aspects as things to see in the shared environment. O’Sullivan is thus a step closer to McDowell, and away from Travis. Perhaps even this: what aspects are, their ontology, is to be investigated by looking at what the description of their experience involves. Travis seems to shy away from that. Elsewhere, he takes aspects to be objective looks, available for seeing in the shared environment (Travis 2016). And if so, the discussion about aspects makes no room for a distinction between two kinds of seeing, and for construing aspect experiences as a particular sort of experience, as O’Sullivan does. Critically, in both Travis and O’Sullivan, there is not much attention to the variety of kinds of cases and experiences related to aspect-perception. Specifically, to the difference between cases in which aspect-experiences ‘occasion the actual making of judgments’ — as when driving in the dark, suddenly recognizing a ferret, catching its shape for a brief second, and exclaiming “Ferret!” — and cases where no such judgment is in view, as when a portrait on the wall seems to be smiling at us (Wittgenstein 1958, 205). Not in view, as a result, is the possibility that concepts may play a role in aspect-perception apart from a role related to judgment making.

On the whole, I very much recommend this volume to anyone interested in Travis’s philosophy or in the history of analytic philosophy (including later Wittgenstein and Austin). Travis, at any rate, is one of the few who has a good story of that history to tell.


I’m grateful to Edmund Dain, Oskari Kuusela, Michael O’Sullivan, Duncan Richter, and Dafi Agam-Segal for their help and suggestions.


Agam-Segal, R. (forthcoming), “Avner Baz on Aspects and Concepts: a Critique,” Inquiry: An Interdisciplinary Journal of Philosophy.

Baz, A. (forthcoming), “Bringing the Phenomenal World into View,” in: Wittgenstein on Objectivity, Intuition, and Meaning. Conant J. and Greve, S. (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Travis, C. (2013), “The Silence of the Senses,” in: Perception: Essays after Frege, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 23-58.

Travis, C. (2016), “The Room in a View,” in: Wollheim, Wittgenstein, and Pictorial Representation: Seeing-as and Seeing-in, Kemp, G. and Mras, G. M. (eds.), New York: Routledge, 3-33.

Wittgenstein, L. (1958), Philosophical Investigations, 3rd ed., Rhees, R., and Anscombe, G. E. M. Anscombe, (eds.), Anscombe, G. E. M. (trans.), Oxford: Blackwell.