The Philosophy of Creativity: New Essays

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Elliot Samuel Paul and Scott Barry Kaufman (eds.), The Philosophy of Creativity: New Essays, Oxford University Press, 2014, 326pp., $49.95 (hbk.), ISBN 9780199836963.

Reviewed by K. E. Gover, Bennington College


The philosophical tradition has long concerned itself with those aspects of our existence that are distinctively human: justice, knowledge, virtue, consciousness, art, politics, and reason. Creativity, while no less a constitutive feature of human life, has largely escaped philosophical scrutiny, particularly in the Anglo-American work of the past century. It is worth reflecting on why this might be so. Insofar as creativity was seen as the work of divine, irrational, or unconscious forces, it is unsurprising that it did not appear as a subject suitable for conceptual analysis and critical reflection. Creativity is undoubtedly important, but it is not clear what sort of philosophical purchase might be gained in an area that has long been understood and experienced as inherently mysterious.

Appropriately enough, the work of demystifying creativity was taken up by science, particularly psychology, where it has exploded into a major area of research. Now that several decades of this work has been accomplished, the time seems right for philosophy to re-enter the conversation. Informed by the current scientific understanding of creativity, philosophers are better able to take up the questions pertinent to their discipline: What is the value of creativity in a human life? Can creativity be learned? Is it best understood as an activity, or in terms of the products of that activity?

This new collection of essays on the philosophy of creativity gives us a view of the possible directions that contemporary philosophical attention to the subject can offer. The contributors include philosophers, psychologists, and neuroscientists, which reflects the editors' recognition that their subject requires an interdisciplinary approach. The essays range widely in topic and tone, perhaps a result of the fact that the contributors submitted them independently of one another rather than as the result of a working group or conference. While most of the contributions are strong, the aggregate effect of the collection is somewhat uneven: some of the same ideas are covered in multiple essays (such as Margaret Boden's distinction between historical and psychological creativity, or the notion that creative ideas result from ordinary cognitive processes), while in other respects the coverage is less comprehensive than might be expected.

For example, the three essays gathered under the theme of "Aesthetics and Philosophy of Art," while each interesting in its own right, do not collectively do justice to a subject that has been so central to both the philosophical and popular understanding of creativity. In that section, Gregory Currie presents some challenges to the commonly held view that literature provides valuable insights into the human mind and its workings, particularly the moral dimensions of our experience. He calls this the Positive View. In short, he wonders whether it is true that creative literature yields knowledge, and comes very close to arguing that it does not: "my tentative conclusion is that literature has no significant institutional constraints that push its creative activity in the direct[ion] of truthfulness or impose practical tests for truth on its outcomes" (53). Despite the tentativeness with which he makes this assertion, I am not sure that many people, literature-lovers among them, would disagree with the claim that literature is not truth-oriented in the way that science is. It seems unfair to compare literature to science as a form of knowledge-seeking, since that is clearly not its primary aim or function. An advocate of the Positive View might argue that literature offers a different kind of insight into human experience than science can provide, but then it becomes unclear how we can test the truthfulness of those insights if they are not empirically verifiable. Currie's skepticism about the truth-functionality of creative writing raises the question of why we value literature so much if it does not tell us anything important about human life, but his argument does not actually strike a blow against creativity as such. As many of the contributors point out, creativity ranges across all dimensions of human endeavor, from mundane problem-solving to scientific innovation.

Noël Carroll takes a somewhat maverick approach by asking whether artworks require not only the creativity of the artist, but of their audience. He argues that the activity of following a fictional narrative is no less an act of imagination and creativity than that which generated it. While he is undoubtedly right that understanding a fictional narrative requires active, complex cognitive processes, the notion that simply paying attention to an artwork is itself a creative act stretches the concept too thin. This does not mean that there is no room for creativity on the part of the audience: as he points out at the end of his essay, the act of interpretation can be an occasion for considerable insight and even innovation. But at that point we have moved from passive audience member to active critic.

Christopher Peacocke's essay on what makes a piece of music "Romantic" is an erudite and interesting discussion that effectively weaves together research in music history, music criticism, and philosophy of mind. However, it does not speak directly to the theme of creativity, except to raise the peripheral question of what it means to compose music in a particular style, and whether that is a constraint on individual creativity. These three essays leave untouched a host of other important questions pertaining to creativity and aesthetics: Is artistic creativity different from other modes of creative thinking? Why do we value novelty so highly in the arts? How does Kant's theory of genius square with the psychological findings on exceptionally creative artists?

While the artist as a paradigm for the creative individual was not a central concern for Currie, Carroll, or Peacocke, he makes his appearance in some of the other essays. For example, Matthew Kieran uses Van Gogh as an exemplary case of someone who was not only highly creative, but who displayed considerable intrinsic motivation to be so. He argues that such a disposition is a virtue of character in the Aristotelian sense. While Kieran is right that we regard highly creative individuals as praiseworthy, it seems to me that we value them primarily for what they produce. This is different from praising someone for a disposition toward honesty or courage, which is a way of behaving. I also wonder whether the idea that creativity is a virtue is compatible with the research, cited by some of the other contributors, suggesting that extreme creativity correlates to psychopathology. If we ought to cultivate creativity as a character virtue, this implies that we can, at least under certain favorable socioeconomic circumstances. But what about the fact that so many of our culture's creative heroes, Van Gogh among them, displayed such extraordinarily divergent thinking at the expense of crippling mental illness and distress?

This brings us to a theme that weaves its way throughout many of the essays: creativity and the irrational. As I mentioned earlier, in both the philosophical tradition and the popular imagination creativity has been seen as a mysterious force, coming either from some external force -- the muse, nature, intoxicants -- or from the inner workings of the unconscious. Whatever the putative source, creativity has been long understood as separate from, or even incompatible with, conscious thought. This belief is perhaps reinforced by the experience of having a creative insight "pop" into our minds, unbidden. Many of the contributions address this misconception in some way. Simon Blackburn, for example, believes that "Romantic tropes have done enormous damage in recent culture," because they present creativity as a kind of divine gift rather than a capacity nurtured by grit (156). He seeks to demystify creativity by identifying it with ordinary conscious processes. His thesis is reinforced by the psychology experiments described in Roy Baumeister, Brandon Schmeichel, and C. Nathan Dewall's "Creativity and Consciousness," in which they conclude that optimal creative activity actually requires the help of the conscious mind. They conducted experimental tests in which people were asked to perform creative tasks while simultaneously performing some other conscious activity. For example, accomplished musicians were asked to create an improvised jazz solo while counting backward by six. Their music was judged to be much less creative than that of the control group. (The question of how one evaluates and ranks the creativity of, say, jazz solos, is an interesting one in itself, but was not addressed in the paper).

Another variation on the theme of demystifying creativity can be found in the contributions by Berys Gaut and Alan Hájek. Since we learn through imitation and rule-following, both of which are seen as inimical to creativity, it seems paradoxical to assert that it is teachable. Gaut argues that, contrary to popular opinion, creativity can be learned. In an earlier article, Gaut himself points out that neither mechanical nor chance processes of making can properly be called creative.[1] Thus it is particularly surprising that he endorses the use of heuristics, a set of discipline-specific rules, in educating people to be creative. This tension can be resolved when we note that the use of problem-solving techniques does not guarantee the production of creative insights, but it can train the mind to perform the kind of thinking that will favor the generation of new and interesting ideas. Whether one succeeds in being creative will depend on a number of factors, only some of which are under one's control. But both Gaut and Hájek do a persuasive job of reminding us that creative insights do not just fall from the sky.

The frequency with which the contributors emphasize the fundamental compatibility of creativity with conscious thought shows two things. First, no longer consigned to the realm of the inherently unknowable, this important aspect of human experience can be further illuminated by philosophical and scientific research. Second the fact, however, that this must still be demonstrated is an indication of just how powerful the myths and misconceptions surrounding the nature of creativity continue to be. This is particularly striking when we consider that the importance of imitation, training, practice, and intentional efforts for the performance of creative work has long been known. I think of the ethnographic research conducted by Albert Lord and Milman Parry in the 1920s on Serbo-Croatian bards. They had a tradition of oral poetic composition in performance that Lord and Parry believed closely resembled the practices of the Homeric rhapsodes in ancient Greece. While Plato's Socrates argues that Ion must be out of his right mind in order to produce such moving recitations of epic poetry, Lord and Parry paint a very different picture: the bards they studied had been absorbing and practicing their art since childhood. They may have invoked the Muse for their performances, but it took a lifetime of diligent preparation to earn her favor. It is hard to believe that Plato was unaware of the essential role that focused effort played in poetic composition, especially since he was such a creative genius himself. Perhaps the lesson here, congruent with the findings in this volume, is that creativity can and must be cultivated, though it cannot be compelled.

[1] Berys Gaut, "Creativity and Imagination," in Berys Gaut and Paisley Livingston, eds., The Creation of Art. New Essays in Philosophical Aesthetics. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press 2003, pp. 150-151, cited in Bence Nanay's essay in this volume.