The Philosophy of Death

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Steven Luper, The Philosophy of Death, Cambridge UP, 2009, 264pp., $28.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521709125.

Reviewed by Harry S. Silverstein, Professor Emeritus, Washington State University



This volume discusses a wide variety of issues related to its title. Luper divides the discussion into two parts: “Dying” (chapters 1-6) and “Killing” (chapters 7-9). Part I in turn has two main components: (a) a discussion of basic background issues, beginning with a consideration of the nature of life (chapter 2) and culminating in a consideration of the nature of, and criteria for, death (chapter 3); and (b) a discussion of puzzles going back to (at least) Epicurus as to whether — and, if so, how — death can legitimately be regarded as bad for the person who dies (chapters 4-6).

Chapter 2 (“Life”) provides a summary of relevant biological information, and concludes that something “is alive just when it has a … substantial capacity to maintain itself using processes that are controlled by durable replicators”, where “durable replicators” are “replicators that are able to mutate, augment themselves, and bequeath mutations”. It also considers alternative views regarding the nature of human beings — alternatives with different implications as to “when we persist” — viz., “animal essentialism”, “person essentialism”, and “mind essentialism”. Chapter 3 (“Death”) distinguishes death as a process from death as a “momentary event” and considers various conceptions of the latter; it also discusses alternative views regarding appropriate criteria for death, including criticism of the current “brain death” criteria employed in both the US and the UK.

In the “Epicurean” chapters — chapters 4-6 — Luper considers a variety of issues relating to the Epicurean view that, when one has ceased to exist, one is not a possible subject of either goods or evils, and, hence, that both the “harm thesis” (that death can be bad for the person who dies) and the “posthumous harm thesis” (that “posthumous events can harm us”) are false. Luper, opposing Epicurus, accepts both the harm thesis (as do most of those who have discussed these issues) and the posthumous harm thesis (about which opinion may be more divided). In Chapter 4 (“Challenges”) he considers, among other things, the question of whether Epicurus’s view is properly thought of as applying to death as a process — i.e., to dying — or merely to death as a state. Applying it to death as a process seems dubious — after all, a dying person still exists, and thus is a possible subject of goods and evils; moreover, the process of dying may involve pain, which Epicurus of course regards as an evil. Luper nonetheless says that restricting the application of his view to death as a state would make Epicurus’s “efforts … disappointing, given his wider concerns” — concerns whose goal is "to enable us to achieve ataraxia" (tranquility), which “cannot be complete” if we are concerned about “the dying process”. Chapter 5 (“Mortal Harm”) defends a “comparativist” conception of interests, a conception that allows us to judge, e.g., that S‘s death is bad for S if the longer life S would have lived had she not died when she did would have been better, viewed as a whole, than her actual, shorter, life. This, however, still does not answer the Epicurean challenge to supply an acceptable answer to the question "When is death bad for the person who dies?" Luper considers this challenge in Chapter 6 (“The timing puzzle”). His contention is that (a) we need not respond to this challenge — i.e., we can say there is no time at which death is bad for us, that it is “timelessly” bad, but yet (b) “priorism” — the view that death, and posthumous harms in general, harm us while we are still alive — constitutes a plausible response.

Chapter 7 (“Killing”) considers the question of when killing is “directly wrong” — i.e., when it is prima facie wrong “because of the way it affects the one who dies”. Luper defends what he calls the “Combined Harm-Consent Account”, an account on which “killing competent persons [roughly, persons capable of rational choice] is directly wrong just when they have not made an informed choice to be killed, and killing incompetent persons is directly wrong just in case … it harms them”. This account is then applied to the issues of suicide and euthanasia (Chapter 8) and abortion (Chapter 9).

Many of Luper’s claims can be questioned; I will conclude this review by questioning some of them. But there are other concerns, such as: what is the book’s intended audience? Luper’s discussion, in general, favors breadth over depth; a large number of issues and controversies are discussed briefly, but few are pursued in great detail. Hence, the book would probably be more useful for students as a course text than for professional philosophers concerned with a thorough presentation and assessment of a relevant view or issue. Nevertheless there are few courses that consider both the Epicurean issues discussed in chapters 4-6 and the issues discussed in chapters 2-3 and 7-9; the former would standardly be considered in metaphysics courses, the latter in ethics courses — particularly courses in bioethics or biomedical ethics. These concerns, however, should not be overstated. Enough of the book is relevant to courses of each kind that it would make a reasonable text, or at least supplementary text, for either. It would be useful, in my view, for upper division undergraduate courses in bioethics and biomedical ethics, and metaphysics courses whose topics include at least some of the issues involved in the Epicurean puzzle at both the graduate and advanced undergraduate level. Moreover, the book’s style is in general both clear and, as the book’s cover claims, “lively and engaging”; students should therefore find it both accessible and interesting. The fact that a number of Luper’s claims are questionable implies that students should be encouraged to read the book critically and to engage in further research regarding claims they think should be challenged, but such a policy is of course appropriate for philosophy courses in any event.

In questioning some of Luper’s claims I shall begin with the introductory chapters (2 and 3), continue with the “killing” chapters (7-9), and conclude with the Epicurean chapters (4-6). I consider first Luper’s claim that life requires replicators that include the capacities to mutate and “bequeath mutations”. Suppose that our world, all of whose living things include such replicators, was created by a deity who decides to give his young intern the task of adding a new species to the mix. This intern, who is interested in fables, decides to create a group of unicorns and to place them in a remote part of South America, where they are discovered by human beings in due course. But this intern is both more rigid and less imaginative than his master was when he performed the original creation; in particular, the intern wants the unicorns to remain unchanged as a species forever. Hence, he makes their replicators mutation-proof. The inability to mutate might, of course, make them less able to adapt to a changing environment, and thus less able to survive as a species in the long term. Nevertheless the unicorns seem clearly to be living creatures — particularly since, as we can assume, they are capable of normal reproduction. Hence, I fail to see why Luper regards the ability to mutate as, in effect, a necessary condition for being alive.

Turning to chapters 7-9, one concern is Luper’s discussion of the “Subject Value Account” — an account that ascribes “especially great”, in many cases even “absolute” value, to human beings, and which thus seems to allow us to defend intuitively plausible results regarding the wrongness of killing on essentially consequentialist grounds. Luper ascribes this account (albeit somewhat tentatively) to Kant, and though the interpretation of Kant on this issue is of course controversial, I think this ascription is a serious mistake. The special status of human beings in Kant’s theory does not, in my view, consist in, or derive from, their having great value — that would make Kant a consequentialist (not a hedonistic consequentialist, to be sure, but still a consequentialist), which he most emphatically is not. Rather, this status is centered in the fact that human beings are rational agents (beings capable of acting on the basis of reasons), and the principles for the treatment of human beings (and indeed all rational agents) derivable from this status are not merely independent from, but prior to, any consideration of “value”. A common, and I think fruitful, way to express this idea is to say that what is important about human beings is not that they have great “value” but that they have certain basic rights. This brings us to what I think is the most serious deficiency in these chapters: Luper never makes any serious attempt to consider “rights”-based theories and their account of the wrongness of killing. Consider again the “Combined Harm-Consent Account” — the account he ultimately endorses. His full statement of this account is the following:

Combined Account: If S is an incompetent subject, killing S is directly wrong just in case (and to the extent that) it harms S; if S is competent, killing S at time T is directly wrong just in case S has not made an informed choice to be killed at T. (p. 161)

Thus, the only issue relevant to incompetent subjects — subjects not capable of making a rational choice — is the consequentialist issue as to whether killing them would cause them net harm. And the only issue relevant to competent subjects is whether they have made an “informed choice” to be killed — which means, in effect, that the only right Luper considers (and even this is never explicitly characterized as a right) is the right not to be killed without one’s informed consent. This is surely inadequate. On the one hand, the account allows only consequentialist “harm” considerations, and thus no consideration of rights, in cases involving those it deems “incompetent” — which for Luper explicitly includes “youngsters who will gain competence if they continue to develop” (p. 160). Thus, it implies (unacceptably, surely) that killing such a “youngster” would be permissible if we determined, in our wisdom, that, taken as a whole, his or her life, were that life allowed to continue, would be slightly below the neutral or zero line so far as welfare is concerned. On the other hand, by allowing, for competent subjects, no consideration of anything other than informed consent, it rules out any consideration of other relevant rights — and thus, among other things, provides no guidance in cases involving a conflict of rights. What are we to say, for example, about a case of S’s killing another person, P, in self-defense, where (as would normally be the case) P — the person posing the threat — does not consent to being killed? “Rights”-based theories can approach such issues in a variety of ways: they can organize rights into hierarchies, or claim that describing rights with the requisite specificity eliminates the apparent conflicts, or that rights can be lost or suspended through immoral behavior — such as threatening another’s life — and so on. Luper’s account, however, seems to allow us to say only that just as P’s killing S would be “directly wrong” because S does not consent to being killed, so S’s killing P would be “directly wrong” because P does not consent to being killed. To be sure, Luper is careful to insist that he is making claims only about what is prima facie wrong, not what is wrong all things considered. But an account of "prima face wrong" should provide a foundation for — or at the very least provide ideas that are fruitful in the search for — an account of “wrong all things considered”, and Luper’s account, by contrast, seems to this reviewer to be little more than a dead end.

The final two issues I will discuss involve the Epicurean section. The first concerns what Luper calls “the experience requirement” (pp. 107ff.) He claims that both Stephen Rosenbaum and I “have tried to bolster Epicurus’ case against the harm thesis” by replacing the Epicurean “requirement for harm” — viz., that “something harms us only if it causes us pain” with the “weaker” requirement that “something harms us only if we can experience it”. He then goes on to argue that even this “weaker” requirement fails; he observes, for example, that we “cannot experience being in a coma” and yet we “can be harmed by being comatose”. However, though he properly notes that my view requires only that a harm can be experienced, not that it actually is, he makes no mention of a second, and crucial, distinction between my view and the more standard views — viz., that on my view a harm need not be a possible cause of negative experiences or feelings, but need merely be a possible object of such feelings. It is the combination of (a) the view that harms need only be possible objects of negative feelings with (b) the adoption of a four-dimensional framework — a framework that allows us to claim that future events and states can be such objects — that makes it possible for me simultaneously to accept a modified “experience requirement” and yet reject the Epicurean claim that death cannot be bad for the person who dies. (Readers for whom Luper’s book is their first introduction to these issues may thus be quite puzzled as to how I can — or even quite unaware that I do — accept the harm thesis and reject the Epicurean view.) My “object” conception of the experience requirement sidesteps Luper’s criticism; even if we “cannot experience being in a coma”, a comatose state is a possible object of one’s negative feelings either before it occurs or after it is over. Further: in criticizing the “subsequentist” solution to the “timing puzzle” — the view that the time at which death harms one is the time following one’s death, the time during which one would otherwise have been continuing to enjoy life’s goods — Luper appeals to the claim that the dead lack a property he calls “responsiveness” and thus lack “the capacity to accrue” goods and evils. But I think Luper’s rejection of any version of the experience requirement confronts him with a dilemma: if one’s “responsiveness” is construed as having no connection at all with one’s capacity for experience, then it is not clear why one cannot be regarded as “responsive” when one is dead (which is perhaps just a way of saying that on this assumption it is not clear what “responsiveness” is). If “responsiveness” is not construed in this way, then Luper’s “responsiveness” requirement is itself a version of, and thus he has not succeeding in rejecting, the experience requirement.

This brings us to the timing puzzle, the final issue I will discuss. As noted above, Luper contends both (a) that the question "When is death bad for the person who dies?" need not be answered — that we can say that death is “timelessly” bad and nonetheless (b) that “priorism” (that death is bad for us while we are still alive) provides a plausible answer to this question. He rejects alternative answers, including “eternalism” (that death is bad for us eternally, at all times), “subsequentism” (that — as noted above — death is bad for us after it occurs), and “indefinitism” (that the time of death’s badness is “indefinite” — a view he ascribes to both Thomas Nagel and me). Though I agree with Luper in rejecting both “eternalism” and “subsequentism”, I also reject “priorism”. Moreover, I am not an “indefinitist” (nor, I believe, is Nagel — though of course I cannot be as definitive about Nagel’s views as I can about my own) unless “indefinitism” is construed — as Luper acknowledges it can be construed — as "equivalent to the position that death may timelessly [I would prefer the word ‘atemporally’1] harm us" (p. 138). My view, in short, is that all attempts to answer the “When” question fail, and that the only proper response to it is to reject it. I lack the space to provide a general defense of the view that rejection is the only proper response to this question,2 but I will briefly criticize Luper’s defense of priorism. This defense relies ultimately on an argument he gives back in the “Mortal Harm” chapter (Chapter 5), the argument that (a) a desire is a desire that a proposition be true; (b) if I desire, e.g., that I marry some day, the relevant proposition — that “I am married eventually” — is, if true, true now; and hence © “my desire is fulfilled now” (p. 92). I find this sophistical. It’s like saying that, because “Dick Cheney is snoring somewhere” is, if true at all, true here — where “here”, let’s suppose, is my study at home in Spokane — Cheney’s snoring itself must be going on in my study. The marriage desire, surely, is not fulfilled until the marriage takes place, despite the “now” truth of the relevant proposition. (Moreover, Luper himself uses, if not this same point, at least a very similar point in arguing against eternalism.) If this sophism is avoided, then, in my view, Luper’s argument for priorism collapses.

The criticisms briefly expressed in the last half of this review should not be given too much weight, or allowed to obscure the book’s virtues; they show merely that I disagree with Luper on a number of points — and disagreeing with each other is, after all, what philosophers do! It remains the case that the book is clearly and engagingly written, and would be a useful component of courses in bioethics, biomedical ethics, and metaphysics.

1I prefer “atemporal” to “timeless” in this context simply because “timeless” is commonly understood to mean “eternal” or “extending through all time”.

2 This view was articulated briefly in my “The Evil of Death Revisited”, Midwest Studies in Philosophy 24 (2000), 116-135 — see especially footnote 6, p. 131 [from p. 121], and footnote 13, pp. 133-134 [from p. 130]. I explain and defend it more extensively in both “The Time of the Evil of Death”, in J. Campbell, M. O’Rourke, and H. Silverstein, eds., Time and Identity (Cambridge: MIT Press), forthcoming; and “The Evil of Death One More Time: Parallels Between Time and Space”, in James S. Taylor, ed., The Metaphysics and Ethics of Death (Oxford: Oxford UP), forthcoming.