The Philosophy of Derrida

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Mark Dooley and Liam Kavanagh, The Philosophy of Derrida, McGill-Queen's University Press, 2007, 164pp., $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780773532359.

Reviewed by Matthew C. Halteman, Calvin College


The Philosophy of Derrida is the latest installment in McGill-Queen's Continental European Philosophy series -- a line of books that aims to furnish accessible introductions to the work of influential European thinkers, all the while "combin[ing] clarity with depth, introducing fresh insights and wider perspectives" and "providing a comprehensive survey of each thinker's philosophical ideas." It goes without saying that producing an introduction to Derrida that is at once clear, deep, original, and synoptic is a tall order to fill.

Dooley and Kavanagh succeed in a number of important respects. They offer a brisk but wide-ranging rendition of the increasingly popular narrative in which the seemingly disparate emphases of Derrida's "early" and "later" work are unified by an underlying continuity. Highlights along the way include an informative take on Derrida's relationships to Freud, Husserl, and Heidegger, and a more insightful and even-handed treatment of Rorty's interpretation of Derrida than is typical. Accompanying these strengths, however, are a number of problems that, according to reviewers, have also challenged other recent introductions to Derrida. Such problems include the taking of a somewhat insular approach that hesitates to subject Derrida's guiding assumptions to critical scrutiny, an underdeveloped assessment of alleged points of contact between "Derrida and analytic philosophy," and an account of Derrida on "ethics" and "politics" that leaves these central terms ill-defined and pays insufficient attention to the difference between doing ethical or political philosophy and inquiring into the conditions of possibility for doing ethical or political philosophy.[1]

The authors' strategy in this volume is to "bring clarity to the philosophy of Jacques Derrida" through an investigation of his "fundamental concern" with "the related questions of memory and identity" (p. vii). In using the term "fundamental" to describe this concern, the authors seem to mean it in a more robust sense than one might expect from commentators assessing a thinker widely perceived as a virulent critic of essentialism. Indeed, their ambitious hope in reading Derrida by dint of the themes of memory and identity is nothing short of "making explicit what [lies] implicitly at the heart of all Derrida's works" (p. ix).

As Dooley and Kavanagh see it, the difficulties widely associated with reading Derrida are less a function of the complexity of his ideas than of his regrettably obscure prose style and the reluctance of commentators to attempt thematic treatments of the central thrust of his work. The "simple idea" that lies "behind all the controversy," they claim, is that "full self-understanding is impossible because we cannot roll back the layers of time and history that precede us to reveal our origins in their purity"; in a nutshell, there is no such thing as "pure" identity since identity is a construction of finite memory (p. ix). By reading Derrida in light of this "simple idea," the authors maintain, we may come to see that deconstruction is "neither radical nor iconoclastic," but is motivated, instead, by the desire "to preserve the best of our philosophical, scientific, religious, and political traditions" (p. ix).

Borrowing some Derridean phraseology, the authors characterize this kinder, gentler deconstruction as a means of negotiating "the catastrophe of memory" through "the work of mourning" -- that is, of confronting the "impossibility" of knowing fully who we are by discerning within the fragments of our dislocated past the ideals, values and institutions that are worth preserving, albeit through a process of ceaseless dismantling and recontextualizing that can't aspire to the full-blooded "mastery over the past" for which the likes of Plato and Hegel once yearned (5).  The upshot here is the familiar point that deconstruction is best understood not as a repudiation of the Western tradition leveraged from some critical standpoint outside it, but rather as a way of critically appropriating the tradition from within, both by targeting the aporias and exclusions that necessarily perforate finite human understanding and by activating "other" insights and epiphanies that the tradition has left underdeveloped or untapped. 'Mourning' is the operative metaphor for this way of inhabiting the tradition, according to the authors, because it captures the central tension between "keeping and letting go" that drives deconstruction. Like a grieving heir sorting scattered keepsakes from a deceased great-grandfather, Derrida sifts through the remnants of philosophy's gap-ridden history, acknowledging its "irretrievable loss," but nonetheless harboring the "impossible desire" to "keep and preserve it, and give it new life" (8).

When the authors are at their most precise, they parse this "impossible desire" more instructively in terms of a "desire for the impossible." It is not, after all, the desire for unconditional understanding that is impossible (as the history of philosophy all too clearly attests), but rather the putative object of that desire -- unconditional understanding itself, or in the authors' idiom, pure identity assured by perfect memory. As finite, historical beings, our understanding and its applications are always conditioned by our contingent circumstances, and as the saying goes, we desire most what we cannot have. It is thus the fundamental human experience of lacking unconditional understanding (and lacking it essentially) that gives rise to the irreducible desire for it. But if we are simply stuck with this desire (as the authors, following Derrida, seem to assume), there is still the question of how best to channel it.

The problem with the traditional answer -- ventured, as the story goes, by Plato, Hegel and their minions -- is that it forgets the impossibility of achieving the object of its desire and seeks, in vain, to institute a future in which "all particulars will be consumed by, and accorded their proper place in, the … totalizing grasp of the universal" (11). For Dooley and Kavanagh, Derrida's wisdom lies in his recognition that, despite the impossibility of unconditional understanding, the desire for it, when properly harnessed, can afford us a certain critical distance from the conditional constructions of our "present" and their inevitable exclusions and injustices -- the distance, that is, of an as yet and always undecided future in which our perpetual dismantling and reappropriation of old constructions ("mourning") might lead to new and (conditionally) better ones (17-19, 127-147).

The book's four chapters trace the shaping influence of this "desire for the impossible" across Derrida's critique of the metaphysics of presence (chapter one), his "theory of language" (chapter two), his deconstructive readings of other critics of presence such as Freud, Husserl, and Heidegger (chapter three), and his more recent forays into ethical and political thought (chapter four). Though the point may be lost on introductory audiences, seasoned readers of Derrida may observe, either in agreement or in protest depending on their outlook, that this approach accords a certain privilege to Derrida's "later" work insofar as it situates the "earlier" work on language, psychoanalysis, and phenomenology primarily in terms of concerns over responsibility and justice.

While this organizational strategy allows for streamlined coverage of many of the major themes of Derrida's philosophy, one conspicuous omission is the lack of attention paid to the import of his work for religious reflection -- an issue that Derrida himself and many influential commentators have investigated in significant depth.[2] Also, though the book includes a four-page "Afterward" that strikes the major chords of the study one last time in a summary mode, the absence of a bona fide conclusion coupled with a general lack of integrated engagement from chapter to chapter make the book feel more like a series of related texts on a guiding theme than a unified monograph. As for supporting notes and bibliographical content, the book provides considerably less by way of research help than some other recent introductions to Derrida.[3]

As one might expect from an introductory text, the interpretation of Derrida on offer here is fairly standard both in method and in content. The authors' expository strategy evokes the "chain of supplements" approach popularized in the late 80's and early 90's by Rodolphe Gasche, Geoffrey Bennington and others.[4] This technique involves suturing together provisional expositions of the many and varied tropes that Derrida employs to glimpse the limits of oppositional thinking, allowing each stitch in the chain to supplement the incompleteness of the last one as well as to elicit new questions and problems that call for the grafting in of the next trope and so forth.

In chapter one, linked expositions of key Derridean tropes such as circumcision, disjointed time, cinders, the gift, and the Jew introduce readers to the internal critique of presence through which Derrida's "mourning" is carried out. What these tropes collectively demonstrate is that "all economies that attempt to organize themselves around presence, completeness and life cannot -- despite their attempts and protestations to the contrary -- completely exorcise the ghosts of absence and loss, incompleteness and death" (19). Though the authors chart this territory along the borders of memory and identity, the lay of the land will nonetheless look decidedly familiar to those who have surveyed it using older maps. In the tradition of Gasche, Bennington, Norris, Critchley, Caputo and others who have redressed the once prevalent stereotype of Derrida as anti-philosopher, Dooley and Kavanagh give us a Derrida who evinces his fidelity to the philosophical tradition by demonstrating its shortcomings in hopes of uncovering fruitful possibilities for future interpretation.

In chapter two, this fidelity is on display in Derrida's philosophy of language, which the authors characterize as a sustained critique of the tradition's "attempts to efface the necessity of writing from identity and historical memory" (21). What Derrida has in mind by "writing," of course, is not the literal word on the page, but the movement of the open system of differences through which meaningful signification is produced. The first half of the chapter provides a serviceable if predictable tropology of the "figures of mourning" mobilized in Derrida's critique. Among the usual suspects are Plato's pharmakon, archi-writing, différance, structuralism's play of signifiers, and iterability, all of which testify to "the fact that identity is always divided in itself," both spatially as a "differential play of traces" and temporally as a "presence … marked by traces of [past and future] absence" (39).

The second half of the chapter brings these insights to bear on analytic philosophy of language, first drawing out points of tension by recourse to Austin and Searle, and then highlighting points of commonality with reference to Wittgenstein, Quine and Davidson. The majority of this material is a lengthy and rhetorically heated defense of Derrida against "misconceptions" of his work promulgated by Searle's much-discussed criticisms of  "Signature, Event, Context," Derrida's 1977 essay on Austin (44-58). While the authors are right that the Derrida-Searle debate is a useful archive for correcting certain "clichéd misrepresentations" of deconstruction (albeit clichés that were arguably more prevalent two decades ago than today), the pedagogical value of their coverage is compromised by its omission of certain contextual details and its zeal for putting Searle in his place. Though there is little disagreement, for instance, that Searle misinterprets certain of Derrida's views, these infelicities may look slightly less like "wild misrepresentations" (44) "symptomatic of a disturbing ideology" (57) had the authors taken note of the fact that Searle's criticisms came before the advent of serious English-speaking philosophical engagement with Derrida at a time when literary criticism was popularizing similar clichés in Derrida's name.[5] After devoting nineteen pages to Austin and Searle, the authors commit just six pages to drawing Derrida, Wittgenstein, Quine, and Davidson together as critics of the "essentialist pretensions" of traditional philosophy; needless to say, they leave themselves little room to provide the uninitiated reader with a nuanced understanding of the issues underlying the "lively debate"[6] they claim is afoot "between readers of Derrida and readers of Anglo-American philosophy" (58).

Dooley and Kavanagh seem more at home in chapter three, where their task is to witness Derrida mourning the legacies of his philosophical forefathers, Freud, Husserl, and Heidegger. Once again, their story may ring a bell: Derrida's work is unthinkable without these "seminal" forebears who "prefigured" his critique of presence, but in the end he shows all three to be complicit with the very absolutizing tendencies they were trying to resist (67). Familiar though the narrative may be, the details of the story as told here culminate in a helpful interpretative schema for engaging (at least provisionally) the relationships among the thinkers in question, and for observing the dynamic of "keeping and letting go" that the authors associate with mourning.

What Derrida wishes to keep is his predecessors' recognition, contra the tradition, that memory and identity are constructs of historical repetition within a contingent and evolving system of differences (parsed here in terms of "postal" and "archival" metaphors). Derrida wants to let go, however, of what he sees as their lingering "nostalgia" for a pure origin which manifests itself in their efforts to separate the essence of memory and identity from the historical mechanisms through which they are constructed. Husserl and Heidegger, for instance, attempt respectively "to separate the ideal form of meanings from their embodiment in indicative language," and "to purify the essence … of Being of all technology" (97). Derrida's crucial insight, according to the authors, is that these efforts to distill essences from the archival systems said to instantiate them are always already conditioned by the archives from which they are drawn. And since all archival accountings are necessarily historical, and thus, selective and exclusionary ("violent"), the conceit that one has intuited the essence of the archival system merely entrenches the exclusions of the present state of archival affairs, thus closing it off to future mourning -- "the possibility of doing justice to the past" (105).

The upshot of this insight, and the maxim of the fourth and final chapter, is that "the work of mourning is always an ethics and a politics of memory" (107). Here we get a tour of the key tropes from more recent texts in which the "ethical" and "political" resonances of Derrida's broader project become increasingly explicit -- hospitality, infinite justice, the gift of death, the other, and "democracy to come." The picture that emerges, if not altogether clearly, is that "ethics" and "politics" for Derrida are essentially a matter of "negotiating" the "impossible desire" of justice for every other ("unconditional hospitality") with the conditional demands of our singular contexts -- demands that inevitably require decisions that will exclude some others. The idea seems to be that our heightened attentiveness to the regrettable necessity of exclusion will stoke the fires of our "impossible desire" not to exclude, thereby inducing our assiduous reworking of past decisions in the name of an infinite justice that always remains "to come" (145).

What the authors don't provide is a clear explanation on the outset of the difference between "ethics" and "politics," or for that matter, between questions concerning the condition of possibility for ethics/politics -- "archi-writing" or the opening of a matrix of differences within which self and other can come meaningfully into play -- and questions concerning what we might call "garden variety" ethics/politics -- the work of hammering out principles to guide ethical or political behavior in this open matrix. As a result, the chapter is riddled with ambiguity. Derrida is said to have an "ethical theory" (109) that lies "at the heart of his politics" (127) and this work is said to contribute an "immense amount" to debates in "contemporary ethical and political theory" (131). But on which of the above levels is the work a contribution? Without a clear sense of the distinction in mind, uninitiated readers are likely to assume the "garden variety" level. But this assumption would draw scrutiny from Derrida, who has repeatedly admonished attempts to derive an ethics or politics (in this latter sense) from work that he understands as aimed primarily at discerning their conditions of im/possibility.[7] Late in the chapter, the authors clarify these issues somewhat by noting their agreement with Rorty that Derrida is of "little use" for addressing "specific political problems," but they conclude nonetheless, without much by way of argument, that Derrida makes "an innovative and welcome contribution to public political discourse" (136-137).

All in all, the authors' tendency throughout the book to make Derrida the hero of the story sits in uncomfortable tension with their account of mourning. In general, there is a lot more "keeping" going on here than "letting go." To be fair, the authors do raise some concerns late in chapter four about "times when Derrida failed to put his own theory of negotiation into practice" (137-142). But it is telling that even their criticisms of Derrida take the form of holding him up to his own standards. The question is never raised whether "the desire for the impossible" (on which the whole account of mourning as "negotiation" depends) is worth keeping. It may well be, but the likes of Foucault, Rorty, and Zizek would argue that it isn't. Dooley and Kavanagh's case would have been stronger, especially with respect to the task of educating introductory audiences, had they provided readers with more in the way of critical tools for questioning Derrida's most basic assumptions in light of broader currents in the tradition.

[1] Simon Lumsden, Review of Barry Stocker's Derrida on Deconstruction, Notre Dame Philosophical Reviews, 2007.01.02,; and Samir Haddad, Review of James K. A. Smith's Jacques Derrida: Live Theory, Notre Dame Philosophical Reviews, 2006.08.10,


[2] See for example in Derrida, The Gift of Death (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1995); Derrida, Acts of Religion, ed. Gil Anidjar (New York: Routledge, 2002); Mark C. Taylor, Erring: A Postmodern A/Theology (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1984); John D. Caputo, The Prayers and Tears of Jacques Derrida: Religion Without Religion (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1997); and Richard Kearney, The God Who May Be: A Hermeneutics of Religion (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2001).

[3]  The Philosophy of Derrida includes 55 endnotes, a half page of suggestions for further reading in English, and two pages of references. By contrast, James K.A. Smith's Jacques Derrida: Live Theory (Continuum 2005) -- a book of comparable length written for a similar audience --  includes 262 endnotes, a five-page selected bibliography of Derrida's works in French and English, and a five-page selected bibliography of secondary scholarship in English.

[4] Rodolphe Gasche, The Tain of the Mirror: Derrida and the Philosophy of Reflection (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1988); Geoffrey Bennington, Jacques Derrida (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1993).

[5] For a shorter, better contextualized, and more even-handed account of the significance of the Derrida-Searle debate in an introductory volume, see Christopher Norris, Derrida (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1987), 177-186.

[6] As evidence of this "lively debate," the authors make passing reference to just two sources: Derrida's response to a paper given by A.W. Moore ("Arguing with Derrida") from a 1999 conference of the same name (the proceedings are published in Ratio: An International Journal of Analytic Philosophy, XIII 4 December 2000); and Samuel Wheeler's Deconstruction as Analytic Philosophy (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2000).

[7] See, for instance, in 'Passions: "An Oblique Offering"', in Derrida, On The Name (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1995), 15-17; Politics and Friendship: A Discussion with Jacques Derrida, Centre for Modern French Thought, University of Sussex, 1 December 1997, in Derrida, Rogues: Two Essays on Reason (Stanford: Stanford University Press), xv.