The Philosophy of Elizabeth Anscombe

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Roger Teichmann, The Philosophy of Elizabeth Anscombe, Oxford University Press, 2008, 244pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199299331.

Reviewed by Ronald E. Hustwit, Sr., The College of Wooster


Teichmann's book organizes the wide range of Elizabeth Anscombe's writings and presents clear, detailed accounts of her arguments. Beginning with Anscombe's work on intention, Teichmann follows the threads of that concept and her methods of philosophizing through her work on ethics, mind, and language. The book is not an easy read, as Teichmann has difficult subject matter to present; nevertheless, it is an excellent tool presenting the detail and the larger scope of Anscombe's philosophy. Although one would need philosophical background to read the book, one unfamiliar with Anscombe's thought could learn of and from her ideas through Teichmann's accounts of her arguments. Throughout the book Anscombe's and Teichmann's voices often blend into one with the reader unable to distinguish them. Nevertheless, Teichmann interjects his own interpretive and sometimes critical voice. He makes clear the distinctiveness of her work over against Wittgenstein's Tractatus and Philosophical Investigations, and by means of that, distinguishes her work from that of the "ordinary language" philosophers who adhere more closely to the latter. Teichmann provides an excellent record for the history of philosophy of one of the 20th century's most distinguished philosophers. He appends a complete bibliography of Anscombe's works for anyone interested in further studying her thought .

The book contains six chapters, reflecting six general areas of Anscombe's philosophical interests: "Intentional Actions," "Practical Reasoning," "Ethics," "Mind and Self," "Time and Causality," and "Language and Thought." Allowing that there are gaps in his account, particularly the omission of her writings on specific issues of practical ethics and her Catholic faith, Teichmann begins with an account of the central topic of intentional action.

In "Intentional Action," Teichmann reviews Anscombe's claim that there is a separate and describable sensation of intention. One sees the intention in seeing the action. Intentional actions produce a visual sensation. But Anscombe is impatient with ordinary language philosophers who would object that we do not say: "I see an appearance of a sensation." In claiming the existence of a separable sensation, she is unlike those ordinary language followers of Wittgenstein.

The second chapter, "Practical Reasoning," continues with the exploration of intentions by examining intentions in actions. In a variety of ways, she approaches the distinction of the inner and the outer with respect to intentions. An outside observer can describe actions and can say what it is that someone did and what that person appears to have intended. On the other hand, there is the first-person perspective, about which an outside observer might be mistaken. The third-person observer may follow me around at a mall and describe my shopping, but not know whether I am shopping for my wife or for myself. While Anscombe rejects the Humean account of intentions that claims they are separable, identifiable inner causes, she also rejects the behaviorist account. One cannot know the intention from the third-person perspective merely by observing the successive sense impressions of the action. One needs a full account of the intention that includes both first- and third-person perspectives.

Anscombe carefully distinguishes and describes the many aspects of intentions involved in actions showing that it is "doubtful" that intentions are inner processes. They can be discovered through the question "Why?" -- "Why did you do that?" An answer to the "why" question may be followed by further "why" questions. Teichmann goes on to consider Anscombe's Aristotlean project of grouping ends of action under the general heading of eudaimonia.

A cataloging of distinctions with grammatical reflections follows. Discovering the motive for an action is connected grammatically to discovering the intention. A motive is a reason for and not the cause of an action. Still, there are reasonless actions -- "I did it for no reason" and "I just wanted to." There are subconscious intentions, spasms, and doodling -- cases like and unlike intentions. The "Practical Reasoning" chapter follows the pattern of cataloguing distinctions, making grammatical observations that aim at clarifying the concept of intentions as they are present in actions aiming at some good. Teichmann notes Anscombe's proper insistence that the judgments "true" and "false" can apply to a person's intending or wanting the right things. If one wants something, believing it to be good when it is not, one makes a false judgment.

After acknowledging Anscombe's general interest in particular moral problems and her Catholic concerns in moral matters, in the third chapter, "Ethics," Teichmann divides her work in moral theory into three parts: dismantling the fact-value distinction, a legalistic conception of morality, and the rejection of consequentialist ethics. In the first part, he focuses on her rejection of Hume's claim that one cannot derive "ought" from "is," by developing a paradigm language-game case. If a customer pays a grocer for a pound of potatoes, all things considered, the grocer has a practical, yet necessary, obligation to supply the customer with a pound of potatoes. Likewise, the related concept of "promise keeping" involves practical necessity. With respect to the second part -- a legalistic conception of ethics -- Teichmann points out her opposition to Kant's deontological ethics. Logical necessity does not lie in the act itself, nor does a single individual stand as an authority over moral obligation. There must be an authority outside of oneself in order to have a moral law. It makes no sense that one could make a moral law for oneself nor that one could punish oneself for violating a moral law. Moral law is found in the language of the community and authority ultimately comes from God. The obligation, nevertheless, can be and is discoverable by reason apart from God. In this aspect, her moral theory is like that of Aquinas. In the third part of Anscombe's moral theory, Teichmann explains her opposition to consequentialism in ethics. Evaluation of moral actions requires knowing intentions, but consequentialism removes intention leaving only consequences as the basis for good action. Consequentialism removes the basis for absolutely ruling out certain actions -- killing of innocents, vicarious punishment, treachery.

The Catholic use of the "Doctrine of Double Effect" rests upon knowing intentions, nevertheless Anscombe points out how some Catholics have abused that doctrine. So too, the Jesuit practice of casuistry -- the case by case sorting out of principles on the basis of intentions -- though abused, is a legitimate tool for qualifying absolutes in moral theory. Casuistry keeps the central principle while allowing exceptions. She is satisfied with the claim that "generalizations are, for the most part, true." This reflects her satisfaction with Aristotle's account of the virtues: the just man will choose the mean, "all things considered." Anscombe worries that the results of consequentialism will be the overstepping of the rights of individuals on behalf of the good of the whole. "Does Oxford Moral Philosophy Corrupt the Youth?" No, because Oxford moral philosophy is consequentialist and merely flatters the youths' consequentialist instincts.

Understanding "intentions" underlies Anscombe's understanding of mind and self, as Teichmann presents it in the fourth chapter bearing that title, "Mind and Self." The function of intentionality distinguishes Anscombe's views from behaviorism. Rather than reducing the use of the first-person to the third-person, as the behaviorist does, Anscombe focuses on understanding the intentionality of the first-person. Following Wittgenstein's lead, she points out that "I" is neither learned nor used as a referring term. Yet, in a way contrary to the later Wittgenstein, Anscombe works through the ways in which "I" refers to a "self-conscious" proposer of sentences with truth conditions. Here "self-conscious" does not mean having a perception of oneself but rather that one has "the intention that what one says is true of oneself." In giving this account of the referent of "I", she nonetheless explicitly denies that "I" is the name of any sortal concept, i.e., the name of any kind of thing such as a consciousness or a body.

Anscombe is always attentive to the direct objects of intentional verbs. What is intended? Perceptions, for example, are said to be caused by those who hold a causal theory of mind. The dog causes the perception of the dog when I say, "I see the dog." But what causes hallucinations? She explores a similar problem with respect to memory and perception, as no object is present to memory. To analyze such puzzles, Anscombe distinguishes between "material" and "intentional" objects of perception. Roughly, the "material" object of perception is the sense perception and the "intentional" object is the linguistic object of the sentence: "I see the dog." Both are necessary for the analysis of the sentence. She notes that ordinary language philosophers overlook the material object while causal theorists overlook the intentional object. Memory, while a perception, only requires the intentional object for its analysis.

In "Time and Causality," Teichmann reviews Anscombe's grammatical resolutions of these two metaphysical problems. He presents her primary question about time -- "How is it that statements about the past have meaning?" If truth is the criterion of meaning, a puzzle about meaning arises, as there is nothing present to which past tense statements refer. While memory appears to be the key to the answer, the meaning is not found in the present memory image -- one can misremember. The resolution lies in attending to how one learns to use "I remember" and to uses of the past tense as opposed to present and future tenses. These tenses, too, are connected to the concept of a person. Teichmann also presents Anscombe's analysis of the related concept: "The past cannot change." She reveals its hidden nonsense by calling attention to the patent nonsense of its negation: "The past can change." Neither has a relevant ordinary use, that is, neither is about some fact or memory of the past.

Building on, while attacking, Hume's claim that causality is nothing but "exceptionless generalization," Anscombe asks what sense it makes to say that we are testing for exceptions, if we can never discover all the presenting factors involved in a law. Reminding us of uses of "cause," Anscombe "out Hume's Hume" in breaking the hold of the idea of necessity on causality.

In the final chapter, "Language and Thought," Teichmann points out that Anscombe tends toward the Tractatus in maintaining the place of atomic facts and truth conditions in understanding the sense of a proposition. Yet these conditions are not sufficient for grasping the sense of a proposition. Sense, reflecting the influence of the Philosophical Investigations, requires assessing the work that the proposition does. Anscombe maintains with the early Wittgenstein that one can speak about how language is meaningful by showing rather than speaking propositions in a metalanguage. Sense can lie in what is shown. Likewise, sense can be shown in the mysteries of the Christian faith -- Trinity, Incarnation, Transubstantiation -- though they cannot be purged of paradox by reason. Anscombe does not travel the entire route with Wittgenstein to find sense in use. Rather she remains within the parameters of the Tractatus, finding sense in the truth conditions of a proposition. This position leads to a difference in the conception of philosophy from the later Wittgenstein and a difference in the practice of philosophy from ordinary language philosophers such as O.K. Bouwsma.