The Philosophy of Foucault

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Todd May, The Philosophy of Foucault, Acumen Publishing, 2006, 170pp., $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 184465057X.

Reviewed by Carlos Prado, Queen's University


I will begin by recommending this book. It is a well written and intriguing treatment of Foucault's thought. To the extent that there sometimes is more May than Foucault in parts, it is less a matter of interpretation than of engagement with Foucault's thought -- perhaps reminiscent of James Bernauer's Michel Foucault's Force of Flight.

Having said this, I will state my main reservation about the book before saying a little about each of the chapters. My chief concern is that the book misses its audience. It is clearly intended as an introduction to Foucault, from its title to the back-cover description, and in keeping with an introductory-level work, treatment of other figures such as Descartes, Nietzsche, Freud, and Marx is elementary. The material on Foucault is presented in a comprehensive and historically progressive manner and explained in ways that appear to assume little or no prior familiarity with Foucault's work. Unfortunately, this is only an appearance; to benefit from what May says about Foucault, and to balance his take on various points, one already has to know Foucault quite well and it will be those who know Foucault well who will most like the book and profit from it.

Readers unfamiliar with Foucault will find the book difficult and it is likely that they will be at a loss as to what to make of May's more critical discussions of aspects of Foucault's archaeological, genealogical, and ethical analytics. But as important, if not more so, is that readers unfamiliar with Foucault -- after all, the book's intended audience -- will form too benign an impression of a thinker whose thought, which was of a piece with his rebellious conduct, was challengingly novel and whose writing was often disturbing and always deliberately provocative.

May paints a picture in which Foucault's most noble aspects predominate. Oddly enough, that does not enhance Foucault's image. This ennobling is not a new mistake, and May is not the only one guilty of making it. Richard Rorty put the basic problem succinctly in his Essays on Heidegger and Others: Philosophical Papers, Vol. 2, saying that only the French Foucault "is the fully Nietzschean one," and that the Americanized Foucault has all the threatening nihilistic tendencies "drained away" (193). May's is certainly the Americanized Foucault; it is a Foucault driven by venerable Socratic intellectual curiosity and seeking change for the sake of greater philosophical and personal achievement. There is little trace of the Foucault who desperately sought novelty of thought in the darkest and most forbidden corners of human activity, of the Foucault whose turn, from his bleak portrayal of power-relations in his genealogical works to his self-creation-enabling ethics, was perhaps a failure of nerve or at best fear that his genealogical works and account of power would be dismissed as a deterministic dead-end.

The reason the noble image May presents does not do Foucault justice is that it effectively assimilates Foucault to an intellectual tradition he seems to have disdained and often disparaged. It makes Foucault seem an admirable philosopher like Spinoza or Kant. There's not enough of the nihilism -- or at least its threat -- that so many of Foucault's North American fans find upsetting and inconvenient. Someone reading both May's book and James Miller's biography -- which May revealingly and unfairly describes as "breathless" -- might wonder if the two books are about the same person. (131)

May stresses in his introductory chapter how Foucault's key question is "Who are we?" and that it underlies all of his projects and contentions. May then refines the question as "Who are we now?" to better acknowledge Foucault's historicism. (22) One might quibble that if this question is central to Foucault's thought it should be put as "Who am I now?" More questionable is that in some of what May says about Foucault, this underlying question seems to veer too close to being "Who are we really?" at least in spirit, if not in fact, which is quite at odds not only with what Foucault was all about but also with much else May says in the chapter.

Chapter Two, titled "Archaeological histories of who we are," focuses on Foucault's The History of Madness and The Order of Things. May does a good job of conveying Foucault's understanding, as presented in The Order of Things, of the shifts in epistemes from the Renaissance period's reliance on resemblance to understand the relation between language and the world, to the Classical period's minimalist conception of language as related to the world purely as a series of signs for things signified. On the other hand, the treatment of The History of Madness is disproportionately long and less satisfactory. Perhaps May's own background in psychology is partly to blame, but he goes into more detail than necessary -- including considering Derrida's unconvincing and somewhat facile criticism of Foucault's aim in addressing the issue of madness. Again, though, the chapter reads well enough if you know Foucault, but one wonders what those new to his work will make of it.

Chapter Three, "Genealogical histories of who we are," initially won me over in that contrary to, e.g., Dreyfus and Rabinow, I thoroughly agree with May's view that there is a discontinuity between Foucault's archaeological and genealogical analytics. However, a third of the way through I began to feel that the presentation of genealogy, initially in terms of discussion of Discipline and Punish, is too historical, involves largely extraneous comparisons with The History of Madness, and is somehow too muted. It is as if May is trying not to put anyone off Foucault -- "Americanizing" him. The treatment of Foucauldian power is also muted and seems much less central than it ought to be. May stresses Foucauldian power's productiveness as opposed to traditional power's repressiveness, but little is conveyed of power's omnipresence and ever-tightening, stultifying normalization -- precisely what Foucault sought to escape with novelty of thought and alternative histories. The point here is basically the one I make above: May conveys almost nothing of the bleakness of Foucault's genealogical vision.

May's treatment of the first volume of The History of Sexuality, in the second half of the third chapter, is one of the parts of the book I liked most. He presents all the elements of Foucault's genealogical account of sexuality, but does it in a way that without altering anything lends Foucault's account a fresh coherence.

Chapter Four is titled "Who we are and who we might be" and contains what I think best in the book. Pages 100 and 101 present an inspired overview of what Foucault was up to that alone makes the book worth acquiring. May asks what care of the self is, and proceeds to sketch how Foucault's understanding of the relation between the subject and truth changed through his archaeological, genealogical, and ethical periods and how each stage in the progression both defined these periods and contrasted with traditional philosophy. May explains how Foucault turned away from the phenomenological, nearly Cartesian, conception of truth as apprehended, as immediate, and describes Foucault's rethinking of the subject's relation to truth. He characterizes Foucauldian archaeology as mapping "the subject's epistemic placement in an archive"; genealogy as "adding a political dimension to the historical one; and ethics as recasting the relation of the subject to truth from an epistemological one to a practical one in the practice sense of the term." (100-101) On the negative side, May's discussion of problematization and power in Chapter Four is decidedly not for those unfamiliar with Foucault's work.

In my view, Chapter Four also reveals the source of what I think of as May's ennobling of Foucault. May seems to read the last two books, especially The Care of the Self, as the culmination of a philosophical progression that for all its unevenness was a progression nonetheless. From this perspective, the bleakness of genealogy's random histories and power's blindly impersonal normalizing, even the specter of nihilism, look less definitive of Foucault's thought; they look like exaggeration or hyperbole due more to the initial novelty of the ideas than to their centrality in Foucault's work.

The fifth chapter, "Coda: Foucault's own straying afield," predictably attempts a portrait of Foucault, the man, that smooths the rough edges: the tensions, if not inconsistencies, in Foucault's pronouncements about his own work and development; the provocativeness in interviews and public proclamations; the naiveté in political endorsements; the sexual experimentation.

The final chapter, "Are we still who Foucault says we are?" considers whether we have moved beyond the applicability of Foucault's analytics. May lists three great changes that occurred largely after Foucault's death: "fluid networks of control, the rise of the electronic media, the emergence of transnational capitalism and rampant consumerism." (133) He then uses Deleuze, Baudrillard, and Lyotard -- in my view giving each more coverage than necessary, especially Baudrillard -- to ask, for example, whether we have not moved on from the disciplinary society Foucault describes to what Deleuze calls "control societies," given that discipline or control no longer requires institutional containment.

Chapter Six raised anew my reservation about the book and its intended audience. For those unfamiliar with Foucault, what Chapter Six does -- certainly contrary to May's intention -- is to historically circumscribe Foucault's work in a way that too many contemporary readers will interpret as relegating it to the status of once innovative but now surpassed ideas. The first two-thirds of the chapter in effect date Foucault in a way that robs the presentation in preceding chapters of some of its force and immediacy because by the time May defends the timeliness of Foucault's ideas, the damage has been done.

My advice to those familiar with Foucault's work is: get May's book; you will find it challenging and provocative in equal parts. If you are not familiar with Foucault's work, by all means get the book, but get at least one other introduction, or better still, read Foucault -- but do not begin at the beginning; read Discipline and Punish and The History of Sexuality first.