The Philosophy of Gottlob Frege

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Richard L. Mendelsohn, The Philosophy of Gottlob Frege, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 246 pp., $75.00, ISBN 0521836697.

Reviewed by Kevin C. Klement, University of Massachusetts, Amherst


This book is a thoughtful, provocative and well-written piece of philosophy dedicated to Gottlob Frege's philosophical views concerning language and philosophical logic. Despite its general sounding title, the work does not treat other areas of Frege's philosophical works, such as his philosophy of mathematics. Nevertheless, a wide variety of topics are addressed: Frege's sense/reference distinction, the function/argument analysis of language, identity, existence, names, descriptions, quotation, referential opacity, assertion and truth. While portions of the work have appeared in print before, most of the volume is new, and older material has been revised and integrated within the whole. Although it contains a fair number of (mostly minor) flaws, it is, on the whole, a valuable contribution to the philosophy of language and secondary literature on Frege.

The book does not have a large message or primary thesis to argue for, and consists instead of several more focused discussions of particular claims, arguments and puzzles found in Frege's writings. This should not be seen as a failing; indeed, perhaps the best feature of Mendelsohn's work is the attention to detail he musters when attempting to state an argument or formalize a principle. The work is not limited to reconstruction and interpretation: much of it is critical. Mendelsohn does not shy away from identifying problems, errors and places for improvement (as he sees them) within Frege's views. Other philosophers also receive significant attention, especially Russell, whom Mendelsohn often invokes as a figure for comparison and contrast to Frege.

In the preface, Mendelsohn points out that distinctions similar to Frege's distinction between sense and reference had been made in the work of earlier philosophers, such as Mill, Arnauld, and Ockham. Mendelsohn conjectures that the reason Frege's philosophy of language has subsequently received so much more attention lies with Frege's adoption of compositionality principles, according to which the sense and reference of complex expressions depend, in a rule-governed way, on the sense and reference of their parts. After a brief biographical chapter, much of the second and third chapters of the book is devoted to the attempt to formulate Frege's semantic principles in precise terms.

Mendelsohn's intent here is commendable: often these compositionality principles are left in vague terms, and concise but still precise formulations would be very valuable. However, Mendelsohn's own formulations are often less than ideal, largely due to his adoption of certain abbreviations such as "s(…)" for "the sense of …", "r(…)" for "the reference of …", and "Sα/β" for what a certain sentence Sα becomes when the term β replaces the term α in some or all places in Sα. Mendelsohn uses these notations in a way that hinders more than helps. For example, "r(…)" is used both to speak of the reference of an expression, as well to speak of the reference presented by a sense. Indeed, he formulates the following principle (p. 35):

r(η) = r(s(η))

This is supposed to mean that the reference of the expression h is the object presented or picked out by the sense expressed by η. Here, the "r(…)" that occurs on the left side of the equation would seem to stand for a function mapping an expression to the object it refers to, and the "r(…)" on the right side would seem to stand for a function that maps a sense to the object it presents. Since the relations involved are different, Mendelsohn's notation here is apt to cause confusion. A more serious difficulty with the notation is that it presupposes that one can simply speak of the reference of η, or "r(η)", irrespective the context in which h appears. Frege is famous for having declared that one must not attempt to discover the meaning of a word in isolation, but always only in the context of a proposition. Mendelsohn does, in a later chapter of the book, introduce conventions whereby "r0(η)" is used to speak of the reference of h in direct contexts, "r1(η)" is used to speak of the reference of h when embedded in an intensional context such as in the scope of a modal operator, and "r2(η)" for its reference when doubly embedded, and so on. However, there are other ways in which the reference of an expression can vary from context to context. An example Frege gives is the pair of sentences, "Vienna is the capital of Austria," and "Trieste is no Vienna". In the first, "Vienna" serves as the proper name of a city. In the second, "Vienna" refers to a concept. It would be naive simply to speak of


without making it clear in what context "Vienna" appears. A more sophisticated notation for speaking of the reference of η as it appears in some context or position C in sentence S would be preferable.

These oversimplications sometimes interfere with Mendelsohn's attempt to formulate Frege's semantic principles. Perhaps the most important is the principle regarding the substitution of coreferential expressions, which Mendelsohn first states as follows (p. 19):

If r(α) = r(β), then Sα and Sα/β have the same truth-value.

Mendelsohn goes on to argue that this formulation is not correct as stated. This can be seen by considering the following:

(1) 'Cicero' has six letters.

(2) 'Tully' has six letters.

The names "Cicero" and "Tully", as ordinarily used, refer to the same Roman orator. However, sentences (1) and (2) differ in truth-value. Mendelsohn diagnoses the problem as that sentence (1), while containing the name "Cicero", is nevertheless not about Cicero the man, i.e., not about the usual reference of "Cicero". Hence, Mendelsohn reformulates the principle regarding substitution of coreferential terms as follows (p. 23):

If Sα is about r(α), then if r(α) = r(β), then Sα and Sα/β have the same truth-value.

However, there are at least two problems with Mendelsohn's revised formulation. The first is that it seems to take the relation of aboutness as an additional semantic primitive, distinct from reference. From a Fregean perspective, however, it seems natural to suggest that the reason that (1) is not about Cicero the man is that the letters "Cicero" do not refer to Cicero in the context in which they appear, and that generally, what it is for a sentence S to be about some entity x is for S to contain some expression α in a context in which it refers to x. Another difficulty (of which Mendelsohn is aware, but acknowledges only in a footnote) is that the revised formulation is still false for certain sentences that contain multiple occurrences of the same term in different contexts. Consider, for example:

(3) Cicero was an orator and 'Cicero' has six letters.

In virtue of its first conjunct, (3) is about Cicero. Nevertheless, we cannot substitute "Tully" for "Cicero" in (3) in both occurrences without getting something false. Frege's principle of substitution for reference would be better stated as follows: whenever a sentence S contains an expression α in a context C within S in which a refers to x, then it is possible to replace α in S in context C with any other expression b that also refers to x in context C, and the result will have the same truth-value. Certain of Mendelsohn's other formulations, such as an analogous principle regarding expressions with the same sense (p. 39), have similar problems. It would, however, be impossible to improve on the formulations he gives using only the simple notations of "r(…)", "s(…)" and "Sα/β". It should also be noted that Mendelsohn's informal discussion of the philosophical issues involved is excellent, and my complaints about his formulations do not stem from any disagreement on the fundamental issues or the correct interpretation of Frege.

The remaining chapters of the book deal with varied topics, from quotation, to the hierarchy of indirect senses, to the nature of truth and assertion. The clearest and best argued of the chapters are those dedicated to Frege's early account of identity in his 1879 Begriffsschrift, and the following chapter on Frege's distinction between concepts and objects. In the latter, Mendelsohn criticizes Frege for not making it clear to what extent his analysis of concepts as functions, and objects as their arguments, is to be given a part/whole reading, especially at the level of reference. He also criticizes Frege for not making it clear whether it is the notion of an object or the notion of a proper name that assumes priority: is an object defined as the reference of a proper name, or is a proper name defined as an expression that refers to an object? The bulk of the chapter is dedicated to a detailed, even painstaking, reconstruction of Frege's argument for the infamous claim that:

(4) The concept horse is not a concept.

The argument is presented with much more detail and rigor than is usually found in the secondary literature. The core principle underlying the argument is that η is a predicate if, and only if, η stands for a concept. However, Mendelsohn also identifies other subtle but still very necessary assumptions, such as the assumption that η stands for a concept if, and only if, that which η stands for is a concept. Mendelsohn faults for Frege for taking the surface grammar of ordinary language in a sentence such as (4) at face value. If translated into a formal language, (4) would become:

(5) ¬(∃f)(∀x)(f(x) = Horse(x))

which is straightforwardly false.

Perhaps the two weakest of the remaining chapters are those devoted to a comparison of Frege and Russell on definite descriptions and to the Frege/Russell theory of existence. In the former, Mendelsohn discusses the little known treatment of descriptions, or "the"-phrases in the singular, presented in ¤11 of Frege's Grundgesetze der Arithmetik, though its presence is striking given Mendelsohn's own claim in the preface (p. xvi) that Frege did not provide a logical mechanism for descriptions! Mendelsohn complains that Frege nowhere attempted to explain the connection between the semantics of descriptions and the semantics of predicate expressions. While Frege never addresses this issue in particular, he does claim that the sense of a complex expression is composed of the senses of the parts. On the account given for descriptions in ¤11 of Grundgesetze, a predicate expression, or a "concept name", would occur as part of a fully analyzed description. Hence Frege would hold that the sense of the predicate expression should be regarded as part of the sense of the description.

Mendelsohn's account of Russell's theory of descriptions is for the most part standard, though there are places where his wording is sloppy, or his portrayal misleading. For example, he claims that Russell held that "nonexistent objects do not have any properties", which is a very misleading way to word Russell's contention that every sentence containing a non-referring wide-scope description is false. The reason that "The King of France is bald" is false, for Russell, is not that the King of France doesn't have any properties, but that there is no King of France. Mendelsohn also attributes a Meinongian ontology of non-existent objects to pre-"On Denoting" Russell, an interpretation that has been out of favor among Russell scholars for the past decade or more. Mendelsohn also assimilates Russell's "concepts" with his "propositional functions", again contrary to developments in the recent secondary literature. Most egregious, however, is his claim (p. 98) that Russell's use of an iota operator makes his work a precursor to Free Logic. One must remember that Russell's iota operator was just used as a part of an abbreviated notation. It is not part of the primitive symbolism of his logic, and it is not used to form genuine terms. Indeed, one of the main uses of the theory of descriptions is to avoid the need for non-referential terms, which might be described as the defining feature of a Free Logic.

In the next chapter, Mendelsohn presents the view, shared by Frege and Russell, that "exists" is not a predicate in the normal sense, and that existence is a second-order concept, or a property of properties, rather than a property of individuals. Mendelsohn argues against their view, and in favor of a view according to which "exists" is a predicate, albeit a predicate true of everything. His arguments for this seem mainly to rely on the intelligibility (and seeming truth) of such statements as "everything exists", as well as the possibility afforded of giving a uniform treatment to expressions containing definite descriptions. Russell, for example, had to give a different contextual definition for a phrase of the form "the F" in the context "the F exists" from the one he gave for other contexts. Mendelsohn surveys the arguments given by Frege and Russell against taking "exists" as a predicate and finds them wanting.

By and large, Mendelsohn's discussions are not very charitable and he often seems to miss problems with his own views even when they are near the surface of the discussion. In applying his take on existence to the Russellian theory of descriptions, Mendelsohn notes that it makes it possible to give a wide-scope reading to the description in

(6) The King of France does not exist.

so that (6) means one and only one thing kings France, and that thing doesn't exist, according to which it turns out to be false. Mendelsohn does not seem bothered by this, claiming that the narrow-scope reading still makes the denial of existence intelligible. However, it seems counterintuitive for there to be any interpretation of (6) that makes it false. Similarly, in discussing Russell's claim that the argument

Men exist. 
Socrates is a man. 
Therefore, Socrates exists.

commits the same fallacy as the argument:

Men are numerous. 
Socrates is a man. 
Therefore, Socrates is numerous.

Mendelsohn complains that all of the statements in the first argument seem to make sense, adding that "assuming the first premise to mean 'all men exist', we cannot possibly have true premises and a false conclusion" (p. 110). Mendelsohn does not note the oddity of the addition of the quantifier "all" in "all men exist". His view commits him to holding that statements of the form "Fs exist" always involve some unexpressed quantifier, contrary to appearance. Indeed, assuming he accepts the standard Frege/Russell understanding of all-statements as universally quantified conditionals, Mendelsohn is committed to holding that "all unicorns exist" is not only intelligible, but true, since its antecedent would always be false.

Mendelsohn's book is much more a treatise on the philosophy of language than a historical piece on Frege, although themes from Frege's (and Russell's) philosophy of language take center stage. While his arguments are not always compelling, they are always provocative. The work is accessible, and could easily be read by a student with only a small amount of background in analytic philosophy as an introduction to Frege's philosophy of language, or issues in the philosophy of language generally. The problems with it are mostly problems of detail, and it would be a worthwhile read for students and scholars alike.