The Philosophy of Hegel as a Doctrine of the Concreteness of God and Humanity, Volume Two: The Doctrine of Humanity

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Ivan A. Il'in, The Philosophy of Hegel as a Doctrine of the Concreteness of God and Humanity, Volume Two: The Doctrine of Humanity, Philip T. Grier (ed., tr.), Northwestern University Press, 2011, 293pp., $89.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780810126107.

Reviewed by William P. Kiblinger, Winthrop University


Philip T. Grier has newly translated this two-volume commentary on Hegel's philosophy (originally published in 1918 in Russian) by Ivan Aleksandrovich Il'in (sometimes anglicized as "Iljin"). In his foreword, Grier states that "there are several major aspects of Il'in's work that should continue to inspire admiration and interest, as well as some others that, inevitably, may seem outdated or mistaken" (v. 1, p. xi). Grier then contends that "the important insights that Il'in achieved in the interpretation of Hegel significantly outweigh the questionable elements of his reading" (ibid.). On the whole, I concur. Moreover, I suspect that scholars with an interest in Hegel's philosophy -- especially his Science of Logic -- will find much to be gained from a close reading of Il'in's commentary. Although I was originally asked to review only the second volume of the commentary, I found it impossible to confine my comments to that volume alone, and thus they refer to, and take into account, much of what appears in the first volume as well.

Many readers may not know Il'in's work, or may only know of it indirectly.[1] One reason for his relative obscurity among English-language readers has to do with the history of the text and of Il'in's unusual life. Detailing this history and much more, Grier includes an excellent introduction to Il'in's life and work in the first volume. (The second volume contains a separate, brief introduction of its own.) As for the publication history of the text, Il'in's commentary was first published in Russia in 1918 and, as Grier puts it, "acquired a semi-legendary status" among Russian philosophers (notably Gustav Shpet and Aleksei F. Losev), establishing the "high-water mark of Russian writing on Hegel for many decades" (v. 1, p. xxii). However, for a number of political and historical reasons (including Il'in's being exiled, under threat of execution, from Russia in 1922 as an anti-Bolshevik), his work soon came to be regarded as controversial within Russia and was largely suppressed, only to become widely available again in 1946 through an abridged German translation (under the different title Die Philosophie Hegels als kontemplative Gotteslehre) that Il'in himself published after having emigrated to Switzerland (having recently fled from Nazi Germany for political reasons in 1938).

Thus, even scholars familiar with his work through this German version will likely never have seen eight of the twenty-two chapters in this new translation because they were not included in the 1946 German translation. (His ill health at that time and his preoccupation with other projects -- some intensely political -- curtailed his time and energy for this project, which his friends and colleagues had urged him to undertake.) Grier's translation of the entire twenty-two chapters has become possible now through the Russian publication of Il'in's Collected Works, which included publication in 2002 of the full text of his two-volume Hegel commentary. Grier's translation also includes copious annotation with each chapter to clarify more than just textual and philological issues but also the underlying interpretative decisions that inform his translation. He also provides a glossary of key Russian, German, and English terms. Furthermore, Il'in's text contains an annotated bibliography that helps situate his interpretation of Hegel's philosophy within the context of the contemporary commentators of his era.

For those previously familiar with Il'in's work from the German translation, his work undoubtedly seems to focus on Hegel's philosophy of religion. The first volume is entitled "The Doctrine of God," and the last two chapters of the second volume, included in the 1946 German publication, are entitled "The Limit of the Human" and "The Crisis of Theodicy." Thus, readers understandably would take Il'in's chief concerns to deal with an analysis of Hegel's theology and philosophy of religion. However, as is evident from the title of the second volume, "The Doctrine of Humanity," as well as the topics addressed in the eight previously untranslated chapters in this volume (i.e., freedom, humanity, will, right, morality, ethical life, personhood and its virtue, and the state), Il'in's interests and attention span a much broader set of topics, including Hegel's moral, legal, and political philosophy. In his treatment of all of these topics, Il'in's work is marked by several common characteristics: his ambition to create a thematic rational reconstruction of Hegel's work; his view of Hegel's method as primarily phenomenological (perhaps proto-phenomenological in relation to Husserl's eidetic intuition) rather than dialectical; his interpretation of Hegelian logic as a "theogenetic process" and, as such, a logica divina; his view of Hegel's philosophical task, in its grandest sense, as a theodicy, which Hegel ultimately recognizes to be "unsolvable" (v. 2, p. 242). Let me say more about each of these points.

As for Il'in's method, each chapter stands alone as an exegesis of a specific theme, which Il'in views as continuously developing from its earliest appearance in the Early Theological Writings and the Difference essay, then in the Phenomenology of Spirit, through the Science of Logic, and finally taking its mature form in the Encyclopedia of the Philosophical Sciences and the Elements of the Philosophy of Right. (However, Il'in does draw a sharp distinction between these works and the notes of Hegel’s auditors.) Thus, Il'in does not attempt a sequential analysis of any single text, instead producing a "synthesizing constructive explication" of the developing ideas through the course of Hegel's career. Each page of his text is typically littered with references to each work almost like a concordance, blending them together into a single unfolding argument in an attempt to identify the essential logical structure in Hegel's thought. Although such a method of chopping up and recombining materials from different works and even different periods of his career inevitably does violence to the original texts, the result is a masterful condensation of Hegel's mature philosophy, especially that of his Science of Logic.

As Il'in began preparations for his commentary, he managed to spend a year and a half (from the end of 1910 to the spring of 1912) in Germany studying and giving talks at several universities, and one of his mentors during this sojourn was Husserl. This connection likely influenced Il'in's approach to the method of philosophical inquiry, and so his commentary interprets Hegel's method as intuitionist rather than dialectical. To be sure, Hegel's philosophy remains dialectical on his view, but the position of the philosopher remains that of a "passive" observer of the unfolding dialectical process. Grier's introduction quotes from letters, written during the summer of 1911 as Il'in studied with Husserl, in which he explains how his view of the "philosophical act" was developing along the lines of Husserlian phenomenology. In the sixth chapter of the commentary, Il'in lays out his argument that "according to his method of philosophizing, Hegel must be recognized not as a 'dialectician,' but as an intuitivist, or, more precisely, as an intuitively thinking clairvoyant" (v. 1, p. 115).

Strange as this may sound, Il'in attempts to clarify it by noting that the philosopher intuits "by means of thought," and thus it is not the philosopher who practices "dialectic" but the object itself (v. 1, p. xxxvi). However, Il'in does not accept such "clairvoyance" uncritically; he often points out that such speculative clairvoyance can be coupled with "philosophical farsightedness" as when Hegel reads too much into a singular "appearance" of the world and takes it for a "shape" of the world (v. 2, p. 26). Il'in views Hegel's philosophy as finally riddled with blind spots or "empirical nearsightedness" as he (Hegel) tends to overlook various irreducibly irrational elements (the "appearances" of empirical reality) and instead strains to "see" them as part of his rational account (the self-developing "shapes of consciousness"). (I will return to this criticism below.) As for the general point about Hegel's method, many later interpreters of Hegel will make similar claims about him. For example, Jean Hyppolite describes the "intellectual intuition immanent to the dialectical discourse" which reveals the identity of thought and being -- of thinking and determinate thoughts -- "by stopping at these determinations in order to penetrate them and see them become."[2] Grier notes other similar cases of this sort of interpretation: Quentin Lauer views speculative reason as a philosophical kind of "seeing" (i.e., intuiting in thought) the God or objectivity who is present there (v. 1, p. xxxv); William Earle offers a phenomenological analysis of the presuppositions of objectivity (ibid.); Stephen Houlgate, William Maker, and Kenley Dove all appear in further support of this phenomenological reading (v. 1, p. xxxvii). Furthermore, Grier's introduction situates Il'in's position within the context of these other figures and offers a substantive review of their positions in great detail. Thus, Il'in is far from alone in this phenomenological reading of Hegel's method.

More controversially, Il'in interprets the Hegelian logic as "theogenic process" and thus as the logic of divinity. To be sure, Il'in also leaves room for a "methodological" interpretation of the logic, as is characteristic of a functional rather than semantic account of the logic. Il'in by no means dismisses such a "scientific-systematic" approach, but he certainly emphasizes the theological. Even in his chapter on humanity (one of the eight newly released chapters made available in this translation), Il'in claims that "humanity is the Divine in empirical, finite form." He discusses "ethical life" as "one of the states of the Divinity itself" (v. 2, p. 125) and as "a current of Divine Spirit in the personal soul" (v. 2, p. 132). The state is "the real actuality of the Divinity in the world of human cohesion" (v. 2, p. 181). However, it is worth noting that Il'in has a habit of speaking loosely at the outset and conclusion of each section and thus sometimes states the theological interpretation without proper qualification; by contrast, the heart of his analysis differs dramatically in tone and precision. While the theological interpretation remains constant throughout his work, his meticulous suturing of the Hegelian "pericopes" manages to identify and illuminate the subtleties of Hegel's arguments. For example, the treatment of the "speculative concrete" addressed in the first volume, which is too involved to discuss here, deserves continuing attention among contemporary scholars for its lucid rendering of Hegel's distinctive approach to the concepts of abstraction and concretion.

If there is one overarching theme tying together all of the themes of the commentary, it is a critique of the limits of Hegel's grandest ambition to offer a theodicy. According to Il'in, even in his early investigations, Hegel recognized the "tragic nature of the state" and, over time, came to see speculative politics as "helpless to depict the 'absolute state'" by virtue of being unable to "draw a picture mixed from spiritual freedom and chaotic necessity" (v. 2, p. 203). The same problem can be applied to the family and the individual human soul. Here the theme of the first volume -- speculative concreteness -- becomes incorporated into this larger theme of Hegel's failed theodicy: "The nature of the state requires the violation of the law of speculative concreteness" (v. 2, p. 209). If the "absolute state" is to be actual, it must realize the law of speculative concreteness, which means, among other things, that it must "exclude any other-being."[3] However, Hegel came to recognize, according to Il'in, that "in human history in addition to 'rationality' there is revealed also an elemental non-rationality and anti-rationality," and thus there is an "other-being" that cannot be unified in the concrete and absorbed into the absolute.

This recognition requires Hegel to "compromise" his "panlogism," which led him from "the poem of God's path" to "the tragedy of God's suffering" (v. 2, pp. 198, 232). Each time philosophy takes up one or another of the ineliminable elements of non-rational or irrational other-being (e.g., "the thing," "the psychical," "the aesthetic," "the religious," "the ethical," and "the historical"), Hegel is forced to "reconstruct the act of cognition, and on the path of circumvention to assert the 'rationality' of the objective sphere being investigated" (v. 2, p. 142). In dealing with this "profound conflict with the irrational element of being," Il'in claims that Hegel gradually replaces rationality with teleology because his philosophy was "destined to reveal that the terms Divinityand reason are not univocal" (v. 2, p. 243). Thus, "pan-teleologism" (all is purposive) operates under the guise of a bankrupt "panlogism" (all is the concept) once Hegel recognized the impossibility of making good on the latter. Thus, from the point of view of Hegel's ambition, he implicitly, though not explicitly, acknowledges that his theodicy has failed to show that "all in the world is good." From a theological standpoint, this acknowledgement signifies "God's incomplete being" (v. 2, p. 252). The irreducibly irrational element has revealed a theology of a suffering God, and for Il'in "a suffering Absolute is not absolute, and a struggling Divinity is not God" (v. 2, p. 254). This sentence -- at the end of the whole commentary -- is the one and only judgment that Il'in passes on Hegel's theology, and he does not engage Hegel further on the point. For many readers in contemporary theology and philosophy of religion for whom the "tragic" character of divinity is not to be so summarily dismissed, Il'in's conclusion may mark the beginning, rather than the end, of theological discourse.

Philip Grier has done the English-speaking philosophical community a great service in making this rich commentary available to us.

[1] Some readers may recall Hans Küng's praise of Il'in's work as "far and away the most thorough Introduction to Hegel's thought process and theology" published since the end of the Second World War. See p. 22, n. 35 of the English edition: The Incarnation of God: An Introduction to Hegel's Theological Thought as a Prolegomena to a Future Christology, translated by J. R. Stephenson (New York: Crossroad, 1987). More recently, Cyril O'Regan gives Il'in pride of place in his theological interpretation of Hegel's logic in The Heterodox Hegel (Albany, NY: SUNY Press, 1994).

[2] Jean Hyppolite, Logic and Existence, translated by Leonard Lawlor and Amit Sen (Albany, NY: SUNY Press, 1997), p. 36.

[3] He qualifies this by adding, "in the sense that it doesn't want to and cannot limit its good and its aims by an alien good and alien tasks" (v. 2, p. 208).