The Philosophy of Hegel

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Allen Speight, The Philosophy of Hegel, Acumen, 2008, 166pp., $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781844650699.

Reviewed by Mark Alznauer, Sweet Briar College


The late Brand Blanshard, a philosopher by no means unsympathetic to Hegelian thought, devised a system to rank clarity in writing which he illustrated with the following example: "Swift, Macaulay, and Shaw would say that André was hanged. Bradley would say that he was killed. Bosanquet would say that he died. Kant would say that his mortal existence reached its termination. Hegel would say that a finite determination of infinity had been further determined by its own negation" (On Philosophical Style, Indiana University Press, 1954, p. 31). Only someone entirely unfamiliar with Hegel's prose could mistake this for an unfair exaggeration.

Given Hegel's notorious obscurity, both substantive and stylistic, some sort of general introduction to his philosophic thought is almost indispensable. At present, the interested reader is faced with an array of options, to which Allen Speight's The Philosophy of Hegel is the most recent addition. Speight himself mentions several other contemporary introductions to Hegel, including Peter Singer's A Very Short Introduction to Hegel and longer works by accomplished Hegel scholars like Frederick Beiser and Stephen Houlgate. Still others, like David James' Hegel: A Guide for the Perplexed, appear to have been published in the meantime. Like those by Singer and James, Speight's book is a short read and comes as part of a series of commissioned works on major philosophers -- in this case, Acumen's Continental European Philosophy series.

With so much of quality already to choose from, one might suspect that another introduction to Hegel would be superfluous. But Speight's book sets itself apart in an ingenious way by proceeding with an unusually self-conscious attention to its own place within the existing literature on Hegel. Rather than offering a standard overview of the basics of Hegelian thought, or giving a controversial interpretation of Hegel that would need more defense than the space a short book would allow, Speight focuses on those passages and themes which have loomed large in the reception history of Hegelian philosophy, deftly identifying rival interpretations and occasionally pointing to possible directions for future scholarship. Instead of providing a didactic summary, he has chosen to introduce the reader to the vigorous, ongoing conversation about Hegel that has continued, almost without interruption, since his death in 1831.

Speight suggests that Hegel has always seemed most relevant to us during "large shifts in the tectonic plate of Western self-awareness" (p. 2). At such moments, there have been revivals of interest in Hegel, such as the late nineteenth century appropriation by British Idealists like F. H. Bradley and Bernard Bosanquet and the influential reinterpretation of Hegel by Alexander Kojève in 1930's Paris. He situates his own standpoint within a recent resurgence of work on Hegel by both scholars in the history of philosophy (like Frederick Beiser and Terry Pinkard) and analytic philosophers (like Charles Taylor and John McDowell). The current revival, he claims, takes place at a time when the distinction between "continental" and "analytic" approaches to philosophy is becoming hazier while at the same time, within Hegel studies, there has been a reassessment of the "metaphysical" and "non-metaphysical" readings of Hegel. Speight consciously and nimbly sidesteps these old battle lines, drawing both continental and analytic readings of Hegel together, and giving some pointers about how to move the debate about the metaphysical nature of Hegel's writings forward. Following Jürgen Habermas and Robert Pippin, Speight is convinced that Hegel's most distinctive contribution to philosophy was his resolute modernism. It is the contemporary need to rethink the meaning of modernity that Speight finds at the heart of the current resurgence of interest in Hegel and it is this theme that guides his book.

The Philosophy of Hegel has a fairly conventional organization, treating Hegel's works in roughly chronological order. The first two chapters deal, respectively, with the writings of the young Hegel and the Jena Phenomenology of Hegel's middle period. The rest of the book (Chapters 3-7) deals with the old Hegel and his mature system. These later chapters follow the divisions made by Hegel himself in his Encyclopedia of the Philosophical Sciences, though Speight's treatment is somewhat lopsided in its emphasis on what Hegel terms "Objective Spirit" -- ethics, politics, history, art, and religion -- at the expense of Hegel's more metaphysical, scientific and psychological doctrines. This lopsidedness is understandable given Speight's desire to focus on those aspects of the system that have seemed most crucial to his interpreters over the years, and given his interest in the theme of modernity, but I think it does neglect a recent revival of interest in Hegel's metaphysics and in his understanding of "Subjective Spirit" (which includes his anthropology and psychology).

Speight begins with the story of how the young Hegel became old, which has long been seen as essential to understanding the meaning and purpose of Hegel's mature system, a change which is often depicted as a betrayal of youthful idealism in favor of middle-aged accommodationism. Speight's retelling, however, prepares the reader to see Hegel's later writings as the genuine fulfillment of his early work. Particularly helpful is his treatment of the four major essays Hegel wrote prior to the Phenomenology, which are some of the most difficult writings in all of Hegel. From these Speight draws four key ideas: (1) that the dichotomies of the modern world are the source of the need for philosophy, (2) that philosophy must address the threat of skepticism, (3) that there is an important distinction between finite idealism (which acknowledges an external source of cognition) and infinite idealism, and (4) that freedom involves a unity of opposites. Speight is surely right that these early insights help explain Hegel's methodology in his Phenomenology of Spirit, and the project he adopted in his mature work. It would be interesting, perhaps in a longer work, to see these connections developed in more detail.

The chapter on the Phenomenology is the longest and is exemplary of the virtues of Speight's approach. Rather than diving right in, Speight spends several pages addressing the manifold difficulties the text itself presents: its multiple titles, overdetermined table of contents, dubious textual and philosophic unity, and peculiar style. What is most useful about this discussion, and this is typical of much of Speight's book, is that it provides a very quick but accurate sketch of a lot of contested scholarly terrain. Where Speight's discussion of an issue is not complete, the footnotes or the appended "Guide to further reading" usually point the reader to the primary sources of any given debate. When Speight gets to the substance of the Phenomenology, things are handled with the same good judgment and balance. He focuses on three passages: sense-certainty, the master-slave dialectic, and the transition to Spirit. These are undoubtedly some of the most influential passages in all of Hegel, and Speight gives them a fair treatment, simultaneously laying out the basic form of the argument and identifying alternative interpretations. At the end of the chapter, one is left with the impression that there is an unusually profound lack of scholarly consensus about the most basic claims made by the Phenomenology -- and that is surely the correct impression to have.

The next chapter treats Hegel's Logic and system, something that is probably impossible to neatly and accurately summarize within a small scope. Speight's approach to this impossibility is quite sensible. He focuses on the opening section of the Logic, which is sufficiently mysterious on its own with its argument that being is in fact nothing, and that the truth of being and nothingness is becoming. After describing Hegel's argument, he uses this passage to explore crucial features of Hegel's method in the Logic like contradiction, sublation, and dialectic. Speight's comments on these, though brief, manage to avoid the usual clichés, helpfully drawing on the ways these concepts were anticipated in Hegel's early writing and dispelling some of the more commonly held misunderstandings.

The real strength of the book, however, comes in its last chapters, those that deal with ethics and politics, history, aesthetics, and religion. It is these spheres that are most affected by the transformations wrought by modernity, and it is clearly here that Speight finds Hegel to be at his most relevant and insightful. In ethics and politics, Hegel points us beyond the sterile oppositions of Kantianism and utilitarianism, on the one hand, and liberalism and communitarianism, on the other. Hegel's philosophy of art, he thinks, helps explain and draw attention to the increasingly self-reflective nature of modern artistic works. And his thoughts on religion provide one of the deepest reflections on the social significance of religion in an age where the realms of politics and ethics have been given an independent, secular footing. (It is only Hegel's philosophy of history that keeps Speight entirely on the defensive, restricted to rebutting misunderstandings of Hegel rather than making the case for any positive, lasting contribution made by Hegel.) Each of these discussions is short, incisive and attentive to the continuing relevance of Hegel's thought to current work in these areas. The chapter on aesthetics is particularly exemplary, laying out the fundamental difficulty of Hegel's teaching on aesthetics (its two not entirely compatible organizational schemes) with absolutely un-Hegelian clarity.

Speight's consistent emphasis on the ambiguities of Hegel's texts -- their internal tensions and the consequent rifts between various schools of Hegel interpretation -- can be happily contrasted to the magisterial simplifications typical of most short introductions to Hegel's philosophy. This virtue, though, might limit the appeal of his book a little. I would highly recommend it to an advanced philosophy student who wants to quickly and painlessly familiarize herself with the outlines of Hegel's thought and the most prominent debates in the Hegel literature. A true novice, however, might find it less rewarding, not because Speight's arguments are too sophisticated, but rather because Speight's attention to the secondary literature might feel like a distraction to such a reader.

On the other hand, that might be a risk worth taking. It has been said that there are almost as many interpretations of Hegel as there are interpreters. The remarkable achievement of Speight's short book is that it manages to introduce the reader to the basic outline of Hegel's thought without failing to do justice to the plurality of interpretations it has given rise to. With his unobtrusive and sympathetic treatment of the controversies surrounding Hegel, Speight proves to be an ideal guide to the current conversation about Hegel. And his attention to the range of these readings and the multitude of philosophical issues raised by them, gives one the welcome impression that the conversation about Hegel has never been more lively or more worth joining.