The Philosophy of Heidegger

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Michael Watts, The Philosophy of Heidegger, McGill-Queen's University Press, 2011, 300pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780773539174.

Reviewed by Stephen Mulhall, New College, Oxford


This book enters what is by now a rather crowded field: that of providing an introduction to Heidegger's thought (as opposed to a detailed critical engagement with any specific element of it). It aims to survey at least the main themes of Heidegger's writings early and late, rather than focusing exclusively on a particular text or phase of thinking within that immense body of work; and because it also aspires to a certain immediacy and accessibility of style, it tends to avoid detailed engagement with either the established secondary literature or the broader philosophical debates that literature invokes. Both the strengths and weaknesses of the book follow more or less directly from these choices of focus and method.

The structure of the discussion is clear at a general level. After a very brief summary of the main events of Heidegger's life, the second chapter presents Heidegger's interest in the question of (the meaning of) Being as the thread that holds together his life's work; then chapters 2 to 7 present some of the central concepts and themes of Being and Time; chapters 7 to 11 examine a handful of dominant issues in the later writings (covering the period from the 1930s to the 1970s); and the book ends with the now obligatory chapter on Heidegger's politics.

Since there isn't a conclusion, and only a very brief introduction, the reader is given no explicit account of the specific aspects of Heidegger's thought that particularly interest the author, or of what distinguishes the perspective Watts brings to bear on the material from those of any other commentator on Heidegger (not even from those who have similarly attempted to provide an introduction to Heidegger's thought). One might wonder whether the individuality of the treatment rather comes through implicitly, in the choice of concepts or topics to focus upon: but it is hard to believe that anyone faced with the (admittedly unenviable) task of covering the basic elements of Heidegger's thinking would not feel obliged to attend to readiness-to-hand and authenticity, guilt and conscience, truth and meaning in Being and Time, and to art and poetry, technology and Asian thought with respect to the later essays and lectures. Judging by the preliminaries and (as it were) the contents page, then, it's not at all obvious what is meant to distinguish this introduction from its many competitors.

The difficulty is enhanced by Watts' decision sharply to limit his explicit engagement with the secondary literature.  The grounds advanced for his making that decision are perfectly defensible, and it is clear that he is well-versed in the material he only selectively invokes. But the result is that his exegetical discussions tend to have relatively little problem-setting context of the kind that a more elaborate triangulation with the secondary literature would inevitably have engendered, since the creators of that literature usually relate their own contributions to broader philosophical debates and thereby relate Heidegger to those debates in ways that at once sharpen the significance of his work and offer ways of furthering the debates.

As a result, there is a certain tendency for Watts' presentations of Heidegger's positions either to take for granted their superiority to those with which he is in dialogue or to pass over even the most obvious possible criticisms of them. For example, Being and Time's attribution of a certain priority to the ready-to-hand over the present-at-hand is presented by Watts as if justifiable simply by pointing out that we spend more time working with things than subjecting them to scientific study, without even considering the question of why that should give such forms of practical engagement any particular priority when our concern is with metaphysical ontology. For this reason, and even taking due account of the introductory nature of Watts' enterprise, there is a persistent feeling that this commentary shows less sensitivity to the philosophical depths lurking at every step in Heidegger's progress than do many of its competitors. It certainly means that the book is likely to be far more useful to beginning students than to advanced ones, since the latter will have to work out for themselves exactly how Heidegger's work engages with the philosophical tradition and its problems.

If I had to speculate, however, I would suggest that Watts does have a particular interest in 'the Nothing', and more specifically in the way Heidegger's interest in it allows him on the one hand to relate questions of fundamental ontology to what Watts bravely but rightly refers to as questions about 'the meaning of life', and on the other to exploit with an increasing degree of interest a set of connections with Eastern philosophy and religion. The book's scene-setting opening chapter makes much of the role of 'the Nothing' in Heidegger's inaugural lecture and thereafter (although I think Watts misses a trick in failing to stress its pervasive presence in the second division of Being and Time); and this allows the book's later chapter on Tao and Zen to present itself as a kind of culmination of Heidegger's enterprise. This is undeniably an interesting angle of approach.

Even so, I found the opening chapter's more detailed treatment of 'the Nothing' rather misleading than otherwise (at one point it offers as an analogy to Nothing's role in relation to Being the claim -- itself couched in highly misleading terms-- that modern science has revealed so-called solid objects to be almost 100% empty space). Likewise, the final chapter's attempt to illuminate Heidegger by invoking the way Asian thought regards the subject-object duality as sheer illusion seemed to me positively unhelpful (for Heidegger, the worldliness of Dasein no more renders the distinction between human beings and the natural world an illusion than the internal relation between Being and beings rendered the ontological difference a matter of mere appearance). The last chapter also made me realize that, despite Watts' interest in the meaning of life, and his early acknowledgement of the depths of Heidegger's interest in Western religion, his book makes pretty much nothing of the fact of or the manner in which Heideggerian phenomenology borders on the Christian.

Another distinctive feature of this book is connected to its desire to provide an overarching account of Heidegger's intellectual life as a whole. This has the clear advantage of allowing Watts to draw upon aspects of later work in order to illuminate earlier obscurities; but it also carries the risk of importing later articulations of theme and concept into contexts which don't of themselves appear to carry strong traces of them. For example, even the exceedingly brief discussion of truth in Being and Time (in chapter seven) is buttressed with references to much later work, without ever really registering the need to justify the aptness of its invocation in the terms available to the early Heidegger. Watts claims at the outset that such strategies are designed to render Heidegger's thought both more comprehensible and more coherent.  But the strategies raise the very real worry that the coherence achieved is being imposed upon the text under discussion rather than disclosed within it, and they underestimate the extent to which -- for Heidegger -- every new text was a new attempt to think through the difficulties that obsessed him, and hence might itself be traduced by being presented as essentially continuous with its predecessors (just as it would if it were presented as essentially discontinuous with them).

A further peculiarity of Watts' approach amounts to something like an inversion of the above hermeneutic principle. For he is also inclined to present later elements of a Heideggerian text or phase of thought before offering an account of elements that preceded them. Thus, his account of guilt and conscience in Being and Time precedes his account of Being-towards-death (the reverse of Heidegger's order of treatment); and his account of the lectures on 'The Origin of the Work of Art' are preceded by a summary of Heidegger's later detailed exegeses of hymns by Holderlin. In these cases, it is hard to see how his avowed goal of enhancing the comprehensibility and coherence of Heidegger's thinking is being served.

I don't want to suggest that this book does not have real virtues. Watts does in general manage to achieve a very high overall level of clarity and accessibility; he plainly knows the primary texts well, and on the few occasions where I disagree with his construals of concepts and passages, his position is usually a defensible one; and there are passages and chapters -- I think here particularly of the chapter on temporality, and the discussion of 'ereignis' and 'enteignis' -- that achieve a really unusual degree of clarity and illumination in the brief compass allowed. My concern is that the price paid to achieve these very real benefits is rather substantial -- certainly substantial enough for me to feel that its usefulness as an introduction has significant limits.