The Philosophy of Herbert Spencer

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Michael W. Taylor, The Philosophy of Herbert Spencer, Continuum, 2007, 183pp., $144.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826487230.

Reviewed by Fred Wilson, University of Toronto


Herbert Spencer explained what evolution is in the first edition of The First Principles, which constituted the introduction to his whole Synthetic Philosophy, as

a change from an indefinite, incoherent homogeneity, to a definite, coherent heterogeneity; through continuous differentiations and integrations. (cited Taylor, p. 63)[1]

Spencer, however, found this to be not clear enough, and by the sixth edition the explanation had expanded into the statement that evolution is

an integration of matter and concomitant dissipation of motion; during which the matter passes from a relatively indefinite, incoherent homogeneity and during which the retained motion undergoes a parallel transformation. (cited Taylor, p. 164n25)[2]

This has come to be in logic texts an example of a definition that obscures rather than clarifies, and has found a parody made famous by William James:

Evolution is a change from a no-howish untalkaboutable all-alikeness to a somehowish and in general talkaboutable not-all-alikeness by continuous stickingtogetherations and somethingelseifications. (cited Taylor, 63)[3]

That this is how we remember Spencer shows how far his stature has descended from where he was in the Victorian period, when he was often seen as another Newton. (Not only was he so seen by many others, but he also so saw himself -- perhaps the hubris that goes before a fall.)

To be fair, however, when one recalls that one can really define physics not at the beginning but only at the end of the textbook, for only then will the reader understand what is being defined, then one should admit that Spencer's definition, offered only when he is well on into his First Principles, is perhaps not as bad as subsequent tradition, encouraged by idealists in particular, would have it. Some of the vagueness (which does not mean vacuity) derives from its being generic. It appears in the law or generalization that

For any material process there is a law of some specific form under the generic form of evolution.

This is what Spencer means when he proposes that evolution occurs everywhere. (Taylor, ch. 4, brings out the generic nature of the law of evolution.) Assuming that

There are material processes[4]

then the law of evolution is, as J. S. Mill put it, a law about laws: given some specific form of material process it predicts that there is a law for such a process and it has the generic form of being a law of evolution. Discovery of such a specific law of that form will confirm the generic law, but failure to find the law does not falsify the generic law: given the existential quantifier, failure to find the law merely implies that the research has not yet sought hard enough. The generic law gathers together in a unified theory the specific laws that fall under it, explaining those specific laws, and guiding research by locating the generic form of the law that it asserts to be there, there to be discovered. So it is not all just sheer nonsense.

Taylor, aiming to describe the whole body of Spencer's thought, nicely explains the so-called law of evolution, and rightly locates it as central to that corpus, not only to biology, but to metaphysics, psychology, and sociology, and not only to these descriptive sciences but also normatively to ethics. He carefully presents the difficulties in Spencer's central ideas, but never with an unfair emphasis that could make Spencer seem simply dogmatic or foolish.

Spencer argued that the law of evolution itself could be derived from the First Law of Thermodynamics, the law of conservation of energy, or the law of Persistence of Force, as he put it. Force was constant overall, but unequal at different points. That imbalance of forces produces a change, which then re-distributes itself into a greater complexity, which in turn produces more imbalances which produce still greater complexity, and so on. The increasing complexity turns out to be progressive; so the Law of Evolution is also the Law of Progress. Not inevitable progress -- there can be retrogressions -- but overall there is a forward rhythm: overall the universe is changing for the best, and evolution is a good thing.

Perhaps needless to say, the derivation is more than dubious. Moreover, Spencer never reconciled his law of evolution with what physicists came to call the Second Law of Thermodynamics, the entropy law, which states that overall material processes tend to bring about states, not of increasing complexity, but just the opposite, states of ever greater homogeneity.

Moreover, in order to secure sociological progress, Spencer (with Lamarck) had to assume in biology the inheritance of acquired characteristics -- morality once learned would become innate. For many this had a certain plausibility; even Darwin, somewhat reluctantly, thought that that might be so, and suggested a theory of inheritance ("pangenesis") which could make it so.[5] But at the end of the century the work of August Weismann established that the germ cells which carried the information in the mechanisms of inheritance affected the somatic cells but not conversely: characteristics acquired in daily life could not be inherited. Spencer argued vigorously against Weismann but could not overcome the clear empirical evidence for Weismann's theory and against Lamarck's (and pangenesis). As Spencer neared the end of his life, he could see his theory crumbling. His books had sold well and his life, physically, was comfortable, but he grew increasingly bitter as he watched the world taking him increasingly less seriously. Taylor brings out nicely how the downfall of the theory made his old age unenviable.

Taylor locates Spencer's thought in the story of his life, and shows how the latter was entirely relevant to the former. Spencer grew up in Derby where the atmosphere was redolent with the views of dissenters (who worked for nothing less than the non-involvement in their lives of the state and its established church), with a worldview that was scientific, materialist, unitarian and providentialist (Joseph Priestley's impact was clear), and with the evolutionary (and Lamarckian) views of Erasmus Darwin. Spencer laid out his moral theory in the Social Statics (1851).[6] He argued that society was tending towards a state of equilibrium (hence the "statics") in which people would be fully adapted to the social life and therefore both happy and beyond the need for any state regulation of their lives. The providentialist outcome was guaranteed by an overseeing deity. Spencer retained this ethics of his youth throughout his life, but the appeal to a God disappeared. Instead, evolution provided the guarantee. But the theory was not wholly positivist in the spirit of Comte and Mill (who thought Spencer confused): everything, he argued in his First Principles[7] (including the direction of evolution), was dependent upon a supersensible entity that was not really known but which we all feel when we turn within ourselves and which was felt as a moving force that connected all things and guaranteed that causation had a necessity greater than mere regularity as the positivists held. Spencer's world was officially naturalist, but hidden away and encompassing; it is a world we feel but cannot know, the world of the neo-Platonists. Taylor stresses the naturalism of Spencer's worldview and does not say as much about the unknowable as he probably should. But what can you say about it when Spencer argues that it lies outside all possible concepts and all possible thought?

Taylor, too, neglects certain aspects of Spencer's thought that deserve greater emphasis. When going through the Principles of Psychology[8] for this review, I was struck by Spencer's treatment of the idealism-realism issue and his able defence of realism[9]; Taylor barely mentions the issue. Again, Spencer argued that relational data were as psychologically or introspectively basic as non-relational sensory data -- so did James, following Spencer -- disagreeing here with Hume and Locke. T. H. Green argued that there were only relatings of sensations, relatings which implied consciousness, and therefore took Spencer to be arguing that a relation was a datum alongside and separable from non-relational sensory data. Green could not understand that besides facts of the non-relational sort "a is F", there are also relational facts like "a is R to b" which are ontologically and introspectively irreducible to the former. Further, Spencer argued that being red, for example, is unlike being green, and that this implies, contrary to Green, that they are ontologically independent, even though being red is incompatible with being green: the latter is just another regularity among regularities.[10] Mill agreed and so did Russell: it is a central point of empiricist realism. Taylor simply takes for granted (p. 82) the view of others that Green had shown that Hume had "exploded a bomb under realism."[11]

If some aspects of Spencer's System deserve another look, other aspects of Spencer's philosophy are clearly dated. The defence of Lamarckianism is no longer viable, and the defence of the evolutionary point of view in biology is dated.[12] Dated too, is Spencer's extended comparison of biological organisms and social institutions which appears at the beginning of the Principles of Sociology.[13]

Ethics, Taylor makes clear, changes over time. In the early work, God is there to ensure a happy ending. Later, it is the learning theory of association and evolution that provides the guarantee: through trial and error, success and failure, reward and punishment, nature will train us, then we gradually learn to live together, and the social virtues thus acquired are inherited by succeeding generations. We help the process along if we conform to nature's demands: we should work at being successful in living together, and through those successes we shall become effortlessly virtuous. Society in the end becomes the dissenting ideal of a minimal state, something close to Godwinian anarchism. (Taylor points out [pp. 13, 93] that one of the early influences on Spencer had adopted Godwinian principles.) Under the impact of such things as the Boer War (Spencer, like most dissenters, was anti-imperialist), the optimism of his early years lead to a pessimism which, when it mixed with the clear disintegration of his philosophy -- not by criticisms of idealists like Green or the Canadian John B. Watson, but by developments in the basic sciences of physics and biology -- led to the bitterness characteristic of his old age.

If you want a good survey of Spencer's thought, nice but not too probing beyond what has become customary, then Taylor's is recommended. I should also mention Spencer's prose style, which often puts readers off. Spencer is not obfuscating and unreadable in the way that Hegel and Heidegger are. But even at its best, his prose is certainly monotonous and often ponderous. It may be true that Spencer based his style on the best psychological theory then available -- his own -- but nonetheless upon reading Spencer one understands immediately why James' Psychology replaced his as soon as it was published. Taylor's presentation is better than Spencer's: it has the eminent virtue of being clear and readable throughout.

[1] Herbert Spencer, First Principles, first edition (London: Williams and Norgate, 1862).

[2] Herbert Spencer, First Principles, sixth edition (London: Williams and Norgate, 1900).

[3] R. B. Perry, The Thought and Character of William James, 2 vols. (Boston: Little Brown, 1935), vol. 1, p. 482. I always thought James was the source of this parody, but it turns out to have originated with a mathematician named Kirkman. This source has been unearthed by Derek Freeman, "The Evolutionary Theories of Charles Darwin and Herbert Spencer," Current Anthropology, 15 (1974), p. 220, note 35. Freeman is cited by Taylor, p. 164, note 26.

[4] This is a law, just as "There are chairs in this room" is a law; both have predictive force -- though of course both are gappy and imprecise.

[5] Darwin's Origin of Species came out in 1859. The argument for evolution was continued and developed in the Variation of Animals and Plants under Domestication in 1868. See Charles Darwin, Variation of Animals and Plants under Domestication (1868, rev. ed. 1875; new ed. with forward by H. Ritvo, 2 vols., Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1968), Ch. XXVII. The logic of Darwin's theory is discussed in K. Stanford, Exceeding Our Grasp (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2006), Ch. 3. For comment, see F. Wilson, Acquaintance, Ontology and Knowledge (Frankfurt: Ontos Verlag, 2007), pp. 626-630, and p. 649 note 67.

[6] London: Chapman.

[7] London: Williams and Norgate, first ed. 1862, sixth ed. 1900.

[8] London: Longmans, Brown, Green and Longmans, first ed., 1855; Williams and Norgate, second ed., vol. I, 1870, vol. II, 1872. See also F. Wilson, "Herbert Spencer," Dictionary of Literary Biography, vol 262, British Philosophers, 1800-2000, ed. P. Dematteis, P. Fosl, and L. McHenry ("A Brucolli Clark Layman Book," Farmington, MI: Thomson Gale, 2002), pp. 252-265.

[9] Second edition, vol. II, Part VII.

[10] Ibid., Part VI, ch. xxxiv. See also F. Wilson, "Bradley's Critique of Associationism," Bradley Studies, 4 (1998), pp. 5-60.

[11] Taylor refers (p. 167, note 16) to Rick Rylance, Victorian Psychology and British Culture, 1850-1880 (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2000), pp. 247-9. Rylance's discussion is thorough, but on this point he is an unsafe source: he, too, takes for granted that Green's critique of Spencer's logical and ontological atomism is sound. Here Taylor might have been more critical.

[12] In vol. I of the Principles of Biology (2 vols., London: Williams and Norgate, 1866). Oddly, this treatise on biology and biological evolution, while almost wholly dated as a work of science, is crucial to Spencer's System but it does not appear in Taylor's initial list of Spencer's works.

[13] First edition, 2 vols., London: Williams and Norgate, vol. I, 1870; vol. II, 1872; Second edition, 3 vols., London: Williams and Norgate, vol. I, 1885, vol. II, 1885, vol. III, 1896.