The Philosophy of Human Evolution

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Michael Ruse, The Philosophy of Human Evolution, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 282pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521117397.

Reviewed by Gregory W. Dawes, University of Otago


Books whose titles begin "The philosophy of x," where x is related to the sciences, can have two aims. The first is to reflect on the findings of the science in question, the facts that it reveals about human beings and their world. A book on the philosophy of physics, for instance, might ask what physics tells us about the subjects that have traditionally interested philosophers, such as the nature of time or the origins of the universe. The second aim is examine the status of the science in question, asking how it is that we know its claims to be true, or at least worthy of acceptance. What we call "the philosophy of science" does not normally reflect on what the sciences have discovered, but on the procedures that led to those discoveries. Michael Ruse's The Philosophy of Human Evolution sets out to achieve both of these goals. It not only reflects on the issues raised by the idea that human beings are products of biological evolution; it also reflects on the epistemic status of the theory that gives rise to this claim.

Much discussion of these questions has occurred in the context of debates regarding creationism. Creationists are keen to argue that evolutionary science is poor science, and that its claims are morally harmful. Defenders of evolution, on the other hand, argue that the science is good science and that its findings can enrich our understanding of human nature. When it comes to this debate, Ruse is most definitely in the second camp. Although not himself a religious believer, he has vigorously defended both the theory of evolution and the idea that it is compatible with belief in God. Indeed in his book Can a Darwinian Be a Christian? he goes further, seeking to find ways in which Christianity and evolutionary theory can be seen as mutually supportive. These arguments are briefly summarized in the present work. But readers who have grown tired of the evolution and religion debates will be relieved to know that the present discussion ranges more widely.

Indeed,  breadth of coverage is a hallmark of the book: its publisher's blurb claims that it "covers a vast range of topics," and for once this is no exaggeration. The first chapter contains a quick overview of the history of evolutionary biology, with a particular focus on Darwin's Origin of Species, while the second chapter continues by looking at the idea of human evolution, beginning with Darwin's Descent of Man. The third chapter is devoted to epistemological issues, the question here being whether "Darwinian evolutionary theory" is "genuine science, and, if so, . . . good science" (p.66). This covers familiar ground, but also extends the discussion to culture. Do we have good evolutionary explanations of cultural phenomena? Ruse is, at this point, very cautious. He is rightly sceptical about the idea, first put forward by Richard Dawkins, that cultures can be broken up into "memes." But he is also cautious about other attempts to offer evolutionary explanations of cultural phenomena, including religion.

The rest of the book deals with particular issues raised by evolutionary theory. The first of these is the idea of "progress" in evolution. Ruse's discussion here is a helpful one: he distinguishes the various senses in which one can speak about progress in biological evolution and is rightly cautious about the idea, while refusing to dismiss it altogether. This is followed by a chapter on knowledge, in which Ruse not only addresses sceptical worries (which go back, as he notes, to Darwin himself), but discusses the idea, first put forward by Konrad Lorenz, that evolutionary theory might lead to an updated form of Kantian epistemology. Our basic categories of thought, on this view, are what Lorenz calls "inherited working hypotheses" that have been inherited because they have proved their worth (p.140). This leads on to discussions of morality, as well as of gender roles, sexual orientation, and race, about which I shall say more in a moment. The book ends with a chapter entitled "from eugenics to medicine." This frankly acknowledges "the nightmares of the 1930s" (p.228): the widespread adoption, among British and American scientists, of eugenicist ideas, which became unfashionable only when they were ruthlessly put into practice in Nazi Germany. Ruse insists that we are now safely beyond such abuses, although not all readers will be reassured by his example of a benign application: the abortion of fetuses which carry the gene for Tay-Sachs disease. (If this disease, why not others, and who is to decide?)

There are, in other words, particular conclusions here with which readers may disagree. Ruse argues, for instance, that evolutionary theory favours a particular version of metaethics, namely a "moral non-realism" or "ethical skepticism" (p.181), which denies the existence of distinctively moral facts. He also suggests that our existing ethical intuitions are not the only intuitions we could have. A very different system of ethics, one that appeared to us quite abhorrent, might be capable of serving the same evolutionary purpose. This does seem close to Darwin's view (as expressed in chapter 4 of The Descent of Man), but it is not the only metaethical view that is consistent with evolutionary theory. One could hold, for instance, that while there are no moral facts, in the sense of facts that exist independently of our practical reasoning, there is a fact of the matter about what rational agents would agree to, if they followed a certain decision procedure. Given this view, there are limits to the kinds of principles that could be regarded as ethically defensible. On this view, even if natural selection has shaped our motivations for acting morally -- by endowing us with the capacity for both sympathy and rational reflection -- it does not give us the particular ethical principles that we ought to follow.

Such disagreements are, however, to be expected. Nor are they a bad thing, since Ruse's willingness to take a stand on such issues forces readers to articulate the reasons for their disagreements. A book that offers conclusions, however controversial, is better than one that offers a bland overview of competing opinions. So given the constraints of a short volume addressed to a general audience, one might argue that the book achieves its aims and does so admirably. Despite this, The Philosophy of Human Evolution left me feeling uneasy. The source of my unease, I finally decided, was Ruse's sympathy for a kind of popular sociobiology. He may be cautious about evolutionary explanations of cultural phenomena, but he is less cautious about explaining the behaviour of individuals by reference to natural selection.

The term "sociobiology" has, in recent years, fallen out of favour, but the present book bears witness to the fact that its basic doctrines continue to be taught. In particular, sociobiological assumptions underlie Ruse's discussions of gender roles, sexual orientation, and race. Ruse has long been a cautious supporter of the sociobiological program, about which he wrote at length in his 1979 book, Sociobiology: Sense or Nonsense? He ended that work by remarking, sensibly enough, that "human sociobiology should be given the chance to prove its worth. If it cannot deliver on its promises, it will collapse soon enough" (p.214). The question is whether it has delivered on its promises. Ruse's present book seems to assume that it has: it employs sociobiological assumptions while making little effort to examine the criticisms to which they have been repeatedly subjected.

This might be defensible in a short, introductory work, were those assumptions not so questionable. One such assumption is that our evolutionary history, as embodied in our genetic makeup, imposes constraints on the range of behaviours that human beings may successfully undertake. We see this assumption expressed in Ruse's discussion of gender roles. He insists that any evolutionary study of gender roles must take into account "the fact that it is the females who have the offspring" (p.192). And since sophisticated organisms require a long period of gestation and after-birth care, "females are stuck with doing this, whether they want to or not" (p.194). Nor are they merely "stuck with" the childcare role; we might expect that they will want to undertake it. As Ruse remarks, it may be that as a result of our evolutionary history "women want to spend time with their young children in ways that men do not" (p.196). It follows that we "should be cautious about utopian proposals for complete sexual identity" (p.196). Why? Because, it seems, our evolutionary history imposes constraints on how we can live.

It was these remarks, in particular, that made me uncomfortable. Nor was I reassured by Ruse's concession that "nothing in biology is written on stone" (p.196) or that there is no reason why males may not be "brought into childcare" (p.194). (Note the language here: men may be "brought into" a domain that is properly that of women.) Was my discomfort merely the result of political prejudice, flying in the face of a well established science? I think not, for such claims do not merely go beyond any evidence that has been offered in their support; they also go beyond any evidence that could, in practice, be offered.

This point was made, almost thirty years ago, in Philip Kitcher's Vaulting Ambition: Sociobiology and the Quest for Human Nature. How are we to understand the idea that women will, in general, "want to spend time with their young children in ways that men do not"? It cannot plausibly be interpreted as an expression of genetic determinism: the idea that their genetic endowment alone determines what women will desire. It is a truism that our dispositions to behave in certain ways are the product of both genetic endowment and environmental influence, and environmental influence includes cultural factors. Ruse certainly accepts that social and political changes can alter the roles that men and women want to undertake (pp.196-97). It follows, as he wrote in his 1979 work, that "there is no necessity that the future be like the past" (p.100). So how are we to understand the claim that women are particularly disposed to spend time in childcare and that this sets limits to our "utopian" schemes? It can only mean that there is no achievable social and political environment in which men and women would want to share childcare equally. The question is how any biologist, or philosopher, could possibly know this proposition to be true. A casual observation of existing social and political arrangements will surely not suffice.

In his earlier work on sociobiology Ruse seems to acknowledge this difficulty. He recognizes that the confidence with which many sociobiologists make claims about human behaviour "outstrips their evidence" (p.141), and that this is particularly the case when it comes to gender roles (p.158). This is surely correct, but in the present work it seems to have been forgotten. Ruse feels it necessary to point out that some critics of sociobiology are Marxists (p.85) and "Marxism, to be frank, has not had an awfully good track record in the twentieth century" (p.199). True enough. But when claims are made that both outstrip the evidence and have clear political implications, one need not be a Marxist to be suspicious about the uses to which the science is being put.

One strength of Ruse's discussion is that he does distinguish between what he calls "proximate" and "ultimate" causes (p.76), although his identification of "ultimate" with "final" causes runs the risk of confusing biological function with purpose. Nonetheless, he is right to argue that evolutionary theory often deals with the distant causes of phenomena that also have more immediate causes. This distinction should have allowed him to make allowance for the fact that humans often act for reasons, and that those reasons are not, in the first instance, biological. It may be, for instance, that a tendency to act altruistically has become widespread because it leads to a more effective transmission of one's genes, including that for altruistic behavior (p.160). But it does not follow that human beings do not act for genuinely altruistic motives, that is to say, out of a real concern for the wellbeing of others. Attention to this distinction might make us cautious about accepting the idea that "altruism is enlightened self-interest" (p.160) or -- as Ruse wrote in his earlier work -- that "we do that which is right because it is biologically advantageous, rather than because it is right" (p.237). No. It may be that we do what is right because we believe it to be right -- this motivation is the proximate cause of our behavior -- even if our disposition to attend to the welfare of others is the result of natural selection.

So for all its strengths, Ruse's present book is a little too inclined to fall into the familiar errors of a popular sociobiology, errors which (to be fair) he himself has pointed out in earlier writings. Once again, this is not just a matter of advocating views with which many readers will disagree. It is a matter of advocating views that lack evidential support, a failing that is particularly serious when the views in question have social and political implications. The Philosophy of Human Evolution would be an excellent textbook for anyone teaching an advanced undergraduate or graduate paper on this topic. But a teacher might want to supplement the present book with further material, drawn from the work of those who have criticised the sociobiological programe that, despite his own words of warning, Ruse continues to embrace.