The Philosophy of Husserl

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Burt C. Hopkins, The Philosophy of Husserl, Acumen, 2010, 290pp., $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781844650118.

Reviewed by Lilian Alweiss, Trinity College Dublin


Readers searching for an introduction to Husserl will be surprised to find that the first three chapters of this book are dedicated entirely to Plato's and Aristotle's theories of eidos. Why, you may ask, begin by discussing Plato and Aristotle? The natural assumption would be that Husserl himself wrote extensively about them. Yet what marks Husserl out as a thinker is that his initial studies were not in philosophy but in mathematics and the natural sciences, and his philosophical engagement was rather with Descartes and the British empiricists than with ancient Greek philosophy. Hopkins is well aware of this. However, he believes that Husserl's lack of scholarship turns out to be his Achilles' heel. It has allowed thinkers like Heidegger and Derrida to 'hijack' phenomenology by launching a virulent attack against Husserl, arguing that he falls foul of certain presuppositions that have marred philosophy from its inception. For Heidegger it is the fact that Husserl, like the rest of the tradition, has forgotten -- and is no longer puzzled by -- the question of the meaning of being, and for Derrida it is that Husserl is informed by a metaphysics of presence.

So what does the return to Plato and Aristotle promise? Hopkins believes it will take the wind out of Heidegger's and Derrida's sails. We should not regard their 'facile and superficial' (2) reading as authoritative but understand phenomenology's 'true' relation to the beginning of ancient Greek philosophy, a relation that Heidegger and Derrida have obscured with their opinionated readings. Hopkins agrees with Heidegger and Derrida that phenomenology is Platonic in nature. Husserl adheres to Plato insofar as he believes that philosophy should be a rigorous science that should operate without any presuppositions and accept as valid only what it can bring to evidence. Moreover, Husserl argues, the only science that can fit this description is an a priori one directed towards essences or eide. What defines phenomenology is the wish to establish a method that allows us to apprehend or intuit pure essences or eide.

Here Hopkins is in agreement with Heidegger and Derrida. However he argues that their depiction of Platonism is rather anaemic and distorted: they either fail to realise or refuse to acknowledge that there are two distinct accounts of eidos at work in Plato.[1] First, there is the Socratic theory -- as depicted in Phaedo -- which tries to understand eidos in terms of logos or speech (Chapter One). That is the one to which Heidegger and Derrida refer. Yet there is another, the arithmological theory of eidos (Chapter Two) which neither Heidegger nor Derrida acknowledge. According to the arithmological theory, eidos is no longer conceived mereologically. That is to say, eidos is not understood as having something in common with its parts, i.e., as sharing certain characteristics. It rather refers to a common thing that is responsible for the being of things in the visible realm without being part of the sensible world (or being). Eidos relates to multiplicity in the same way as mathematical numbers relate to the multitude.

Take any number, say the number 2: it is constituted by two units. Each unit is one, but, if you take both together, they are two. The number '"2" is not an attribute of either of the units that are united; it is distinct. The same holds for eidos. Motion and Rest in themselves have nothing in common, yet Plato believes that there is nothing in the world that is not both together. They are the fundamental constituents of Being. Being in this sense is analogous to the eidetic Two: It consists of motion and rest, yet is distinct from either of them. At the same time it makes the sensible world appear variable and stable (cf. 40).

Hopkins believes that the arithmological theory of eidos undermines both Heidegger's and Derrida's virulent critiques of Plato. It questions Heidegger's view that philosophy is necessarily a form of ontology. For the unity of the eidos -- arithmologically conceived -- is independent of any multitude of beings and to this extent beyond being. Heidegger's ontology, according to Hopkins, 'is guided by the mereological presupposition that to the Being of entities there belongs a meaning of Being overall' (245). Similarly, Derrida's association of Platonism with a 'metaphysics of presence' is misplaced since eidos -- when arithmologically conceived -- is not part of the multitude of the visible realm. If at all, its defining feature is an absence that is, nonetheless, responsible for what is presented.

Hopkins provides a fascinating read. The discussion of Plato and Aristotle is rich, complex and extremely suggestive. This review barely does it justice. I shall neither discuss the legitimacy or adequacy of his critique of Heidegger and Derrida nor evaluate whether Hopkins' interpretation of Plato and Aristotle is accurate. Rather, what interests me is that Hopkins sheds new light on how we are meant to understand Husserl's self-professed Platonism. This topic, which is the book's centerpiece, should interest anyone working in phenomenology.

The novel claim Hopkins develops is: if we wish to understand phenomenology's true relation to ancient philosophy, we need to realise that Husserl adheres to Plato's arithmological theory of eidos and is thus immune to Heidegger and Derrida's critique. According to Husserl, ideal objects do not stand for perfect or ideal beings, such as a perfect triangle or square, but refer to general or abstract objects (Husserl calls them species). They have not been hypothesised but are assumed when we focus on particular real objects. To illustrate what is at issue, consider Husserl's often cited example: red.[2] Take ten slips of paper each coloured a different shade of red. According to Husserl, as soon as we perceive a particular shade of red we see two things at the same time. First, we see that each slip of paper has its own individual redness or shade of red (it is real). Second, we see that each individual shade of red is an instance of the colour red, which is unitary and does not change (Husserl calls it irreal). The idea of red cannot be hypothesised. It does not refer to the perfect colour red or, indeed, to anything sensible whatsoever. Rather, it refers to a completely different kind of being that is irreal and universal: 'The ideality of what is specific is . . . the complete opposite of reality or individuality' (LI/I I: Sec32: 231). To put it otherwise, 'the individual red does not have the attribute of being red. It is a case of red.'[3]

Although Husserl refers to universals, species and essences here, undoubtedly the ideality of meaning should be understood more generally as referring to that which remains unitary or identical. The claim is that whatever object we experience, we always perceive it both from a particular perspective or vantage point (actual (reell)) and as unitary (ideal), and whatever is ideal can never be turned into something real (reell). Husserl thus understands ideality in the more general sense as 'unity in plurality' (LI/1, I, §11: 196). Hopkins does not discuss the extent to which this general notion of ideality fits squarely with Plato's account of eidos. Rather, Hopkins wishes to draw our attention to the fact that two salient features come to light. One feature is the impossibility of knowing eidos directly through sensible perception. This shows (contrary to the empiricists' prejudices) that what is given is not merely a multitude of sensible intuitions but also the ideality of species. The other feature is that we can only understand Husserl's treatment of eidos if we conceive it arithmologically. Eidos is completely 'other' to appearances,

it must have its source in something that is completely other than one: that is, in a multitude that, because the one is not present in it, is unlimited and therefore 'indeterminately' other than what is one. (59)

The idea of redness functions in the same way as the idea of the one: it points to the 'unity within multiplicity,' a unity that is indeed distinct and irreducible to the multiplicity of beings.

Hopkins realises that this claim needs to be treated with caution. When Husserl calls himself a Platonist, we should not forget that his self-professed Platonism is devoid of metaphysical presuppositions. Husserl rejects the Platonic, metaphysical presupposition that ideal objects exist in a divine mind or realm (topos ouranios) (cf. LI/I I: Sec 31: 230). To return to the example of the colour red, Husserl argues that the colour species red

neither exists in the slip nor anywhere else in the whole world, and particularly not 'in our thought', in so far as this latter is part of the domain of real being, the sphere of temporality. (ibid)

The question that troubles Hopkins is: how exactly are we meant to understand the nature and status of ideal objects. This question, Hopkins believes, informs Husserl's entire work.

We are told that Husserl initially believed not only that acts of intentional meaning instantiate ideal objects, but also that the unity and validity belonging to ideality is characterised as being "already there" before it is apprehended or thought. Hopkins thinks such a position is untenable: 'it can make absolutely no sense to characterize the status of the "being" of these givens as existing independently of the "mind" (understood as consciousness)'. After all, this is why Husserl is not committed to a 'robust Platonism' (100). However, the problem is that Husserl's treatment of eidos remains rather ambiguous: it is not clear whether the intentional object is an immanent object of consciousness or a transcendent one (cf. 101).

According to Hopkins, the initial 'ambiguity of the status' of the intentional object which was both the immanent content of an act and the 'act's extra psychic and therefore transcendent referent' is taken care of by means of the transcendental reduction. The reduction which brackets the questions of existence allows the phenomenologist to focus on the intentional object 'as the meaning (Sinn) instead of the being of what appears' in the act (cf. 112). In a word, Husserl introduces the transcendental reduction because he has come to realise that we can only understand the being of eidos with respect to consciousness; it cannot exist independently of consciousness.

Hopkins believes that with the introduction of the transcendental reduction a third pillar of the Ancient precedent to pure phenomenology comes to light. This time Hopkins turns to Aristotle's refutation of Plato's theory of eidos. Although Husserl adheres to the Platonic arithmological model of eidos (insofar as he does not believe that a single phantasma is sufficient for the intuition of eidos), he realises that eidetic intuition depends on phantasy. Hopkins informs us that Aristotle understands phantasma in two ways: ''As a reference to something absent" and ''as appearing in its own right" (120). The latter bears resemblance to Husserl's transcendental reduction where we come to study appearances as they appear to consciousness 'strictly in terms of what is given in appearance' regardless of being that may lie outside or beyond the phenomena. Similar to Aristotle, Husserl claims that the 'intuition of eide . . . requires phenomena that refer to but do not posit the existence of beings' (121). This interpretation of the reduction is not unproblematic. There are many -- Gurwitch, Dan Zahavi and myself included -- who do not believe that what we are left with after performing the reduction is merely "meaning" and not the being of an object. Rather, the claim is that the being of an object can only be understood from within. Hopkins here seems to be siding with Føllesdal who argues that Husserl leaves us with sense (intentional content) and not reference.

Hopkins does not discuss the debate but notes instead that Husserl still fails to answer fully how we are meant to understand the nature and the status of eidos. We are told that another ambiguity emerges because Husserl still distinguishes between "meaning (Sinn)" and "the being of an object," or the 'phenomenological being' and the being that is "put out of play" by the reduction itself' (112).

After we have performed the reduction the intentional object as a content of phenomenological reflection continues to appear just as it did prior to its being reduced, save for what is manifest in its appearance being now taken as the meaning (Sinn) instead of the being of what appears. (112)

Only in the Cartesian Meditations does Husserl realise that both the meaning and the being of appearances need to be regarded as an accomplishment of transcendental subjectivity. According to Hopkins, at this point Husserl's transcendental philosophy turns into a form of transcendental idealism or monadology as Husserl no longer makes room for a being outside consciousness.

Once this step has been taken, Hopkins believes Husserl's move to history in his final work no longer comes as a surprise. If eidos constitutes itself with respect to consciousness, the question arises of how eidos has come about in the first place. The problem is that we take ideal objectivities to exist independent of our subjective constitution. To overcome this 'alienation' it is necessary to recover their historic or genetic origins that have become sedimented. This calls for a specific historical analysis -- a phenomenology of history -- that Husserl addresses in his last work Crisis. What fascinates Hopkins is how Husserl tries to relate the notion eidos, which is omnitemporal, with the question of genesis and attempts to overcome the 'traditional opposition between historical explanation and epistemological investigation' (175).

However, I am not at one with Hopkins' interpretation. To Hopkins it is self-evident that if ideal objectivities do not exist in a topos ouranios, they cannot exist independent of consciousness (cf. 140). It is not that obvious to me that eidos is necessarily created by us if we leave a robust Platonism behind. Rather, phenomenology wishes to show how consciousness is able to instantiate idealities that are irreal and omni-temporal without turning them into something subjective. The question is how these ideal objectivities are constituted with respect to consciousness. I do not believe that this necessarily implies that consciousness brings them about! Constitution here should not be confused with creation; it refers to the manner in which such objectivities manifest or show themselves to consciousness.

Here I part company with Hopkins' way of interpreting Husserl's concern with origins in his final work. Hopkins suggests that Husserl investigates the origin of eidos. The aim is to account for the 'historical a priori that makes intelligible the original constitution of the ideal, in the precise sense of the objectivity of the logically ideal objects' (176). Yet I do not believe that Husserl ever claims that ideal meanings have their origin in history precisely because ideal meanings are not, as Hopkins believes, produced in consciousness (188), nor produced in mental acts (this indeed is what his refutation of psychologism wishes to show), nor, for that matter, in time. Husserl's concern in his final work is to ask what has given rise to our scientific worldview in the first place. The claim is that we can only understand this question if we begin with the life world and show how, through a process of idealisation, the move from an extra-scientific to a scientific conception of space or time has come about. The question Husserl raises is what has motivated this move. The historical view does not try to show the genetic origins of these ideal objectivities (cf. 199) but seeks to study the conditions that give rise to the pursuit of idealities in the first place. So what is at issue is not the constitution of ideal objectivities but the process of idealisation.

Overall this is a book well worth studying. It covers a wide range of interesting and difficult topics, and even where its interpretations fail to convince, they do not fail to provoke. It sheds much new light on how we are meant to understand the nature and status of ideal objects. The problem is that the three chapters on Plato and Aristotle stand somewhat aloof from the rest. Hopkins provides an innovative and detailed reading of Plato and Aristotle's notion of eidos and thereby invites us to reassess how we are to understand eidetic seeing and, indeed, the nature and purpose of philosophy. However, when he turns to Husserl's work he hardly discusses the complexity of the relation between the one and the many. The Plato and Aristotle chapters merely provide the background for his account of Husserl's phenomenology. However, for me, the journey has only just begun. It would have been fascinating to see exactly how the priority of the One over being is played out in Husserl's work. No detailed analysis is provided about how the arithmological conception of eidos is at work in Husserl. This is unfortunate since it is Hopkins' main and most novel claim. The reader is left with many questions, which Hopkins leaves unexplored. Yet, that these questions arise is part of his achievement -- his innovative approach makes room for debate and breathes new life into Husserl's thought.

[1] I assume Hopkins has taken his lead from Jacob Klein whose writings were the topic of Hopkins’ The Origin of the Logic of Symbolic Mathematics: Edmund Husserl and Jacob Klein. Klein also draws the distinction between the arithmological and Socratic theory of eidos.

[2] Husserl, E, Logical Investigations Vol. I, tr. J N Findlay. London: Routledge, 2001: I Sec 31: 230. Henceforth LI/I.

[3] Husserl, E, “Logik Vorlesungen 1896” in Husserliana Materialien I., ed. E Schuhman. Dordrecth: Kluwer, 2001: 61 n.1