The Philosophy of Luck

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Duncan Pritchard and Lee John Whittington (eds.), The Philosophy of Luck, Wiley-Blackwell, 2015, 224pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781119030577.

Reviewed by Rik Peels, Vrije Universiteit Amsterdam


The notion of luck plays a crucial role in various areas in philosophy: there is, among other things, the concept of epistemic luck in different accounts of knowledge, the theory of moral luck in ethics, the notion of just desert in political philosophy, and all sorts of issues regarding the relation between luck and causation in metaphysics. As far as I know, this is the first edited volume to cover the notion of luck -- especially its nature -- in various subdisciplines in philosophy. One of the volume's key virtues is that it recognizes that the nature of luck -- exactly what luck is -- is crucial to many of these debates. It brings together and provides various new views on exactly what luck is and how particular analyses of luck make a difference to the position one adopts in various debates.

It seems to me the book would have benefited from a somewhat more detailed Introduction. In their short introductory note, Duncan Pritchard and Lee John Whittington only point out how the volume came about. It would have been helpful to have a slightly more detailed exposition of how luck plays a role in these various fields, especially since the book does not cover all of them (it doesn't touch on political philosophy, for instance), and what the state of art of the luck-debate is in these various disciplines, before delving into defenses of particular accounts of luck.

All the essays elucidate the concept of luck in some way or another, except for Sabine Roeser's interesting paper on the Uncertainty Paradox -- the fact that sometimes people prefer a certain outcome at all costs, even when it is the worst case. Her paper is enlightening, and uncertainty and luck are notions that are clearly somehow related, but, unfortunately, it is not completely clear from what she writes how uncertainty and the Uncertainty Paradox in particular relate to luck.

More than half of the essays -- seven out of twelve -- are entirely devoted to providing and defending an analysis of luck. Fernando Broncano-Berrocal argues that luck is a particular kind of risk. E.J. Coffman defends the view that we've been mistaken about the analysandum: the concept of an event's being lucky for someone is parasitic on the more fundamental notion of an event's being a stroke of luck for someone. Joe Milburn also argues that we haven't zoomed in on the right analysandum. He comes up with one different from the traditional analysandum and that of Coffman: what we should analyze is not an event's being lucky, but its being a matter of luck that some person φ-s. Pritchard elaborates and defends his influential modal account of luck. Wayne D. Riggs gives arguments for a lack of control account of luck. And Whittington defends a revised version of the modal account of luck in order to make sense of resultant moral luck.

The remaining four papers treat: whether empirical research shows that there is no such thing as luck (Steven D. Hales and Jennifer Adrienne Johnson), what luck tells us about our intuitions in Frankfurt-style scenarios (Neil Levy), luck and free will (Alfred Mele), and the extent to which we control our own luck (Rachel McKinnon).

It seems to me the book is best seen and read as a catalyst for the debate on luck. For it gives rise to at least as many questions as it attempts to answer. For instance, if the reader sticks with the order of essays found in the book, she will read Pritchard's modal account after the criticisms of that same account by Broncano-Berrocal, Coffman, and Milburn and probably wonder how Pritchard would deal with those objections, as he does not address them in his paper -- which is perfectly understandable, since these essays are all in the same volume. We find various analyses of an event's being lucky, while others in the book argue that that is misguided and that we should focus on another analysandum. Hales and Johnson even argue that strong biases in our luck attributions suggest that there probably isn't such a thing as luck. Clearly, all this calls for mutual critical engagement and discussion. But then, of course, that need not be done in the book itself. It makes clear, though, that more work on luck is needed.

Since I can't do justice to all the essays in this short review, let me just briefly discuss three of them. Broncano-Berrocal does some important conceptual work by exploring the relation between luck and risk. He argues that the notion of luck can be explained in terms of the concept of risk. More specifically, he argues that what's relevant here is not only the risk of lucky events (not) occurring, but also the risk those events pose to agents. Thus, what matters is not only the event-relative sense of risk, but also the agent-relative sense of risk. Subsequently, he defines the agent-relative sense of risk in terms of lack of control. This, however, raises the question of exactly what is gained by explaining luck in terms of risk; doesn't this imply that the good old analysis of luck in terms of lack of control still holds?

Broncano-Berrocal's account also raises traditional worries for lack of control accounts of luck. For instance, he defines 'agential risk' as follows: "S is at risk with respect to an event E if and only if (i) S has an interest N, (ii) if E were to occur, it would have some objectively positive or negative effect on N, and (iii) S lacks control over E." (p. 13) Now, imagine that Mary marries a completely reliable person, Sam, and that she knows that he is completely reliable. Sam is so honest and committed that it is virtually psychologically impossible for him to be unfaithful towards Mary. Broncano-Berrocal's account, however, implies that Mary is at risk with respect to whether or not Sam is faithful to her, since she has an interest in him being faithful, it would be objectively bad if he were unfaithful to her, and whether he is faithful is beyond her control. It seems that Mary is at most fortunate, but not at risk and also not lucky with respect to this -- even though she may be lucky to have run into and married a person like Sam.

Undoubtedly, the most controversial essay is Hales and Johnson's, at least for readers with a background in philosophy. This is because, according to Hales and Johnson, luck is a cognitive illusion. The main project in their paper is to bring empirical psychology to bear on luck attributions. It turns out that framing affects luck verdicts, that is, whether or not an event is ascribed to luck. Longer vignettes with more background info lead to stronger 'lucky' ratings for positively framed scenarios and stronger 'unlucky' ratings for negatively framed scenarios. What also makes a difference is where the critical element is put in the narrative that describes the series of events: in the beginning, in the middle, or at the end.

Needless to say, Hales and Johnson are fully aware of how controversial their thesis and the argument that is meant to support it are. Therefore, they address several objections that might be leveled against their strategy. First, one might point out that people can simply be mistaken and that they need training. It seems to me that this is a path that many philosophers would pursue. After all, we find similar responses to experimental philosophy, for instance, when it comes to analyses of knowledge. Hales' and Johnson's reply is twofold. First, why not apply a modus tollens rather than a modus ponens? In casu: why not assume that there is no right account of luck, that is, that no single phenomenon is involved, and that the project of analyzing luck is, therefore, mistaken? Second, philosophers who believe that there is such a thing as luck should explain why people are systematically and predictably mistaken about luck. (pp. 74-75)

Of course, Hales and Johnson, focusing on the empirical work they have done and its philosophical repercussions, aren't able to address all philosophical objections in this one paper, but it seems to me that philosophers will have a whole repertoire of replies available. For one thing, it seems to these philosophers and to the participants that there is such a thing as luck that is present or absent in these examples. That's a good reason to apply a modus ponens of the kind mentioned earlier rather than a modus tollens. And why should philosophers be able to explain why people are systematically mistaken about luck? People are systematically mistaken about logic, about probability theory, about statistics, and so on, so why couldn't they be systematically mistaken about such a thing as luck? Moreover, it isn't clear from these experiments that the subjects are often mistaken about luck in the first place. This is because it seems it won't always be clear to the subjects with respect to what a person is lucky. One of their experiments describes a case in which a person survives two bus bombings in Tel Aviv. Is that person lucky? Well, it depends: it seems that she was unlucky to be involved in two bus bombings, but that she was lucky, once she was involved in them, to have survived them. And, then, there are of course the events of there being bus bombings, there being two bus bombings, there being two bus bombings at those two locations, one's being at a place where there is a bus bombing (this event occurs twice), and so forth. Therefore, events are all too easily confused with each other and the results would, therefore, not say anything about whether or not people are mistaken about luck attributions. If the experiment is under-described, then people might make a correct judgment about a different state of affairs than the event that the experiments have in mind and if it is described in sufficient detail, one should always take the possibility into account that people are confused about the relevant state of affairs rather than about whether some specific state of affairs Σ is due to luck.

McKinnon addresses the question to what extent we can make our own luck. The title of her chapter -- "You Make Your Own Luck" -- is provocative, for it seems that luck conflicts with control -- hence, the many lack of control accounts of luck that we find in the literature. However, most of her essay is devoted to defending a slightly different claim, namely that people deserve credit for their skill proportional to the expected value, which means that we should be more parsimonious in doling out credit when they are successful and more generous in doling our credit when they are not. It turns out that, in the end, she is as conservative as most people in her views about the extent to which we can control our own luck. People can make their own luck only in the following sense: "better players tend to stay in the game longer and thus tend to have more opportunities for luck to rear its head." (p. 113) Thus, we can control our own luck by controlling the extent to which we have opportunities to suffer from good or bad luck. I take it that that is rather uncontroversial, though: someone who buys a lottery ticket creates the opportunity for a specific lucky event to take place that someone who does not buy a lottery ticket does not. However, as is also the case in all the other essays, McKinnon, in the course of defending her main thesis, makes some interesting conceptual observations. For example, she challenges the distinction between intervening and environmental luck by pointing to the possibility of a situation in which something is about to intervene but then something or someone else intervenes, so that the former intervention doesn't take place and the situation proceeds normally. It isn't clear whether to count a situation like this as a case of intervening luck or environmental luck (or maybe not a case of luck at all).

The book, then, provides a rich repertoire that will be a highly useful resource for conceptual distinctions, original ideas, and new arguments that can be employed in many contemporary philosophical debates that involve the notion of luck.