The Philosophy of Michael Oakeshott

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Nardin, Terry, The Philosophy of Michael Oakeshott, Penn State University Press, 2001, 241pp, $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 027102156X.

Reviewed by Chandran Kukathas, University of New South Wales


Michael Oakeshott (1901-1990) was best known among political theorists, and known more than anything else for being ‘a conservative’. He wrote a famous introduction to the Blackwell edition of Hobbes’s Leviathan, gained some notoriety—as well as a greater following—for his 1962 collection of essays, Rationalism in Politics, and cemented his place as a serious political thinker in 1975 with his book, On Human Conduct. Many conservatives claimed him as one of their own, while critics of conservatism—and neo-conservatism—from time to time denounced him for a diversity of sins, ranging from an alleged ideological stubbornness to an implausible indifference to ideology and to politics. According to John Ralston Saul, Oakeshott was a ‘rational ideologue’, who also believed that ‘politics should be left in the hands of men from the traditional political families’. Yet others claimed that Oakeshott was, in the end, not a conservative but a liberal political thinker.

While few have misunderstood Oakeshott as grotesquely as John Ralston Saul, many have, nonetheless, failed to appreciate the precise nature of Oakeshott’s philosophical contribution. The labels that have been attached to him distort, and even disfigure, his thought, which offers us what is, in the end, one of the most serious attempts in the twentieth century to articulate a theory of politics as a human activity. It is the aim of Terry Nardin’s admirable book to reveal Oakeshott the philosopher, and to make clear that the philosopher—even the political philosopher—is not always a moralist. It looks to show that understanding can in fact be pursued, not for any further purpose, political or otherwise, but for its own sake. Oakeshott took as one of his tasks as a philosopher the understanding of human conduct. Nardin’s task in this book is the understanding of Michael Oakeshott, the philosopher.

The obvious question to be asked here is: why should this be of any interest? After all, Oakeshott the philosopher qua philosopher, has attracted little attention from philosophers, and is read mainly by political scientists. (Nardin himself is a Professor of Political Science, as have been most of Oakeshott’s commentators.) One reason is that even those scholars in political science who read him misread him when they fail to understand that Oakeshott is a philosopher and not a moralist. Nardin’s book helps to make this clear. And this is reason enough to read this study. But a more compelling reason is that Nardin’s book, in expounding Oakeshott’s thought, thereby elaborates Oakeshott’s view about the relationship between philosophy and practical knowledge, and therefore presents for our consideration a thesis that is, if not new, at least striking and challenging. This is the thesis that philosophy does not generate practical knowledge. Oakeshott maintained ‘that philosophy and practice are categorially distinct and that political discourse is raw material for, not the product of, philosophical inquiry.’(p.225)

This is a very different conception of philosophy’s task than that advanced, for example, by the American philosopher, John Rawls (1921-2002). According to Rawls, political philosophy ‘does not, as some have thought, withdraw from society and the world.’ Nor, he continues, ‘does it claim to discover what is true by its own distinctive methods of reason apart from any tradition of political thought and practice.’ In his thought, the importance of a conception of justice lies in its capacity to help ‘put in order our considered convictions about justice at all levels of generality, from the most general to the most particular.’ For Rawls, the ‘work of abstraction … is not gratuitous: not abstraction for abstraction’s sake. Rather, it is a way of continuing public discussion when shared understandings of lesser generality have broken down.’ Political philosophy is public reasoning taken to a higher level of abstraction, seeking ‘to uncover how citizens themselves might, on due reflection, want to conceive their society.’ For Oakeshott, however, moralizing and philosophizing are two very different things. It simply is not the aim of philosophical analysis to provide practical guidance. (p.227)

Philosophical discourse, according to Oakeshott, is demonstrative, while politics is essentially deliberative. Philosophy sets out to arrive at concepts through which to view the world. What the philosopher strives for is conceptual coherence, so that the conflicting evidence of the senses is made sense of. Its aim is to make thinking clear. (p.48) ‘The aim of philosophy is to arrive at concepts which, because they presuppose nothing, are complete in themselves; the aim is to define and establish concepts so fully and completely that nothing further remains to be added.’ (Oakeshott, Religion, Politics and the Moral Life, p.127 quoted by Nardin p.50) Political discourse, however, is for Oakeshott a completely unphilosophical enterprise. More often than not its purpose is to justify or persuade rather than to clarify. From time to time such words as ‘reason’ or ‘equality’ or ‘democracy’ will be invoked, or combined in argument; but the purpose will be to resolve some practical matter, which gave rise to argument in the first place, rather than to become clear about such notions as ‘equality’ or ‘democracy’. Justification, for him, is no part of philosophical endeavor.

Equally, as Nardin carefully explains, a philosophical concept, in Oakeshott’s understanding, ‘cannot be judged according to whether it agrees with the concept from which it has been generated. It cannot be verified merely by reference to ordinary experience, for such experience cannot be both raw material for philosophical reflection and the criterion of its success.’ (p.50) This means that it would be a mistake to appeal to ‘our intuitions’ to try to defend philosophical conclusions. We might liken the enterprise of concept formation and clarification to the grinding of a lens through which to view the world. Assuming that we have no access to the visual world except through some lens, we cannot judge the worth of the lens by direct appeal to the degree of correspondence between what it reveals and what really exists—or even what we think really exists. We have to offer some account of the virtues of a lens in terms that are internally consistent or coherent. Similarly, in political philosophy, we ought not try to establish concepts on the basis of popular usage or intuitions about what ‘justice’ or ‘democracy’ mean. (Indeed, at the margins, popular usage is sometimes completely nonsensical. I was once told by a storekeeper that when a customer disagreed with his policy on returned goods he would try to explain the policy to the customer ‘more democratically’. If this is one popular intuition about what ‘democracy’ means, it surely can offer us little help in establishing how the concept might be deployed!)

For Oakeshott the philosopher, then, the philosopher is not of this world, for to be a philosopher is to live a different way of life. He is someone who, qua philosopher, has no place in the world, for his enterprise has no practical use. While for Rawls, philosophical abstraction is a way of continuing public discussion, for Oakeshott it is a way of abandoning it. For Rawls political philosophy looks to find a way of settling practical questions such as that of establishing ‘the most appropriate family of institutions to secure democratic equality and liberty’. For Oakeshott political philosophy does no such thing but seeks only a coherent way of understanding human experience in its civil condition. Rawls the philosopher would return willingly to the cave of Plato’s famous simile to try to guide its inhabitants to develop better and fairer social arrangements. Oakeshott the philosopher would give no such practical guidance, and would offer, at most, to show why some of the convictions held by cave dwellers will be revealed to be incoherent—illusions—when held under the light of philosophical analysis.

But what, then, is the use of philosophy? In one sense, if Oakeshott is to be believed, it is of no use at all. It does not serve any practical purpose, much less any social purpose. Its aim is not establishment, or even destruction; it is simply clarification of one’s own mind. In eschewing even persuasion as a philosophical task, Oakeshott conceives of philosophy in a way that makes it solipsistic.

Yet, as Nardin makes clear, Oakeshott himself does not adhere consistently to this ideal of philosophy. (p.48) He does argue; he does look to persuade; though he would, perhaps, claim that when he does so he is being less than philosophical. Yet he does also intimate that there is some value in the philosophical enterprise, even if it does not have any practical use. This is in part because understanding is its own reward. It is something that some human beings desire, and so is valuable if only for that reason. But more than this, a clear understanding also makes it less likely that one will be cheated or taken in by those peddling worthless nostrums, promising a cure or salvation.

If we see that this is what Oakeshott takes philosophy to be, we will also be less inclined to read him with a view to extracting a doctrine—to try to find the liberal or the conservative or the moralist of any kind in him. The value of this, as Nardin show us, is that it will give us a more accurate understanding of one the twentieth century’s most imaginative thinkers. More than this, however, it might also lead us to reflect more critically on the practice of philosophy.