The Philosophy of Ontological Lateness: Merleau-Ponty and the Task of Thinking

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Keith Whitmoyer, The Philosophy of Ontological Lateness: Merleau-Ponty and the Task of Thinking, Bloomsbury, 2017, 224 pp., $114.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781350003972.

Reviewed by Michael R. Kelly, University of San Diego


As the work's title suggests, its target audience is scholars who work on Merleau-Ponty's philosophy in relation to twentieth- and twenty-first-century Continental philosophy. The book contains many fine (and fine-grained) analyses of major texts and themes in Merleau-Ponty's philosophy. Whitmoyer puts these analyses in dialogue with reflections on the history of philosophy and classical phenomenology (these seemingly read through the lenses of late Heideggerian and post-Heideggerian French philosophy) as well with figures such as Marcel Proust, Quentin Meillassoux, and Jean Luc Nancy. Though scholars who engage Merleau-Ponty from the tradition of classical phenomenology or analytical philosophy may find the book less approachable, this is an impassioned work in which most readers with an interest in Merleau-Ponty will find much to value and ponder.

The work operates at several levels simultaneously. It presents a close reading of Merleau-Ponty's Phenomenology of Perception interpreted as foreshadowing and consonant with his later Visible and the Invisible. It unites these texts by presenting a view of Merleau-Ponty's philosophy as a radical philosophy that takes seriously the phenomenological 'data' (of temporality, as I read his reading of Merleau-Ponty) and its implications for the dominant (Western) philosophical quest for epistemic certainty. As such, the text also presents a reading of Merleau-Ponty's critique of, and alternative to, Western philosophy. Whitmoyer makes these cases by (1) examining several distinctive features of Merleau-Ponty's thought (e.g., sense, time, interrogation, écart, chiasm, intertwining, ambiguity. a past that never was present, and perceptual faith) and (2) offering close readings of several chapters of Merleau-Ponty's Phenomenology of Perception ("Cogito," "Sense experience," "Temporality," and "Freedom").

Although Merleau-Ponty scholars commonly explore such themes and strategies, Whitmoyer distinguishes himself by placing enormous weight on a heretofore unrecognized feature of Merleau-Ponty's thought (although Whitmoyer admits Merleau-Ponty never uses the term): ontological lateness (5). Whitmoyer coins "ontological lateness" as a shorthand way to refer to the claim that "Merleau-Ponty's philosophical work was oriented toward articulating [a] mode and style for philosophizing that overcomes . . . cruel, Cartesian fear" (2). As a way of referring to this Cartesian fear, Whitmoyer elevates to the status of a term of art a notion Merleau-Ponty mentions in Notes des Cours au College de France:1958-1959 et 1960, namely, "cruel thought." In those lecture notes, Merleau-Ponty writes of a "thought which . . . believes neither in distance nor in appearance, cruel thought, . . . fear of error rather than love [of] truth" (14). Whitmoyer employs this phrase to capture "the fear of error" that drives Descartes's "desire for absoluteness, for security . . . for that which is beyond all doubt" (2). The notion of cruel thought thus is the foil against which Whitmoyer develops the philosophy of ontological lateness (148).

More than just an insecure Descartes on a "search for unassailable certainty" that "seeks to arrive on time to being, to find it right when and where it is in its incontestable finality and presence" (2), Whitmoyer identifies Plato, Aristotle, Augustine and others as complicit in cruel thought. These thinkers share the common agenda of making being conform to the human desire not just for knowledge but for knowledge "understood in terms of absoluteness, total transparency, a diaphanous being that has surrendered all shadow, depth, and ambiguity" (14). Aristotle's Metaphysics A account of the human desire to know, for example, gets interpreted as being "concerned with possession: with reaching out to touch the essence itself in its purity . . . with no degree of alterity, with no écart, no fissure or gap separating this reach from that toward which it extends its hand" (13). According to Whitmoyer's Merleau-Ponty, such totalizing approaches to philosophy construe knowledge (and thus such a mode of philosophizing itself) as an exercise in making being "confess its 'why' to us," to "compel the objects of its inquiry to reveal their secrets" (13). These philosophical representatives of cruel thought are thus "inquisitors," for they assume "a specific relation to being . . . an inquisition . . . and cease to be philia or friendship or love" (2).

This account of Aristotle as representative of the tendency of western philosophy to employ cruel thought (punctuated by Descartes) gives us half of the cruel thought story. Developing the second half of the cruel thought story, Whitmoyer holds that thought "becomes cruel at the point where its own why . . . is . . . a need, a fictive, delusional longing motivated by what it experiences as a lack and absence" (14). The absence could be an absence of security, an absence of evidence, an absence of one's lover, etc. (2-3, 162-5). In any event, the (thinking) self's experience of lack is said to motivate "a kind of obsessiveness that passes itself off as desire, for it is not love that drives this thought forward but fear: of error, of deception, a fear brought forth by . . . anxiety and terror in the face of not being everything" (14).

Whitmoyer's account suggests that "cruel thought" seems cruel both to itself and its other. On the one hand, as a way of overcompensating for its failure to be the whole, the philosophical mode of cruel thought constrains the other (the objects in the world) according to the wishes and ambitions of the same (the knowing subject). Such a mode of philosophizing seems like an abusive spouse who places constrictions, constructions, and demands on the other in the hope of mitigating its (subconsciously recognized or unconscious sense of) impotence -- which analogy I draw from Whitmoyer's involved analyses of Albertine from Proust's Recherche (1-3, 12-3, 16-8, 153, 161-63). Beyond being cruel to the other, cruel thought has, on the other hand, set itself up for disappointment. Cruel thought "signifies a desire for fusion . . . wants to arrive at the scene of being right where and when it is" (13); it's always going to be late to the party (3), however, for "as reflection turns around to put in view what makes it possible, it discovers that any such conditions are in a state of departure" (165).

Cruel thought always arrives late because of ontological lateness, which Whitmoyer presents in two senses: "First, . . . the lateness of reflection to the presence of being . . . This weakness is a function of a second and more fundamental lateness . . . of becoming to being" (2). Cruel thought now appears as impotent, frustrated thought (or thought 'tormented and contested from within'). Insofar as cruel thought never can capture the other in its purity, cruel thought never can satisfy its desire. Operating from a delusional desire that cannot see itself as delusional, cruel thought never can rid itself of its fear, for it has "not been able to recognize and admit" its ontological lateness (76).

Against cruel thought, Whitmoyer's Merleau-Ponty advances a "philosophy of ontological lateness" (2). I take him to mean that Merleau-Ponty offers an approach to philosophy that respects the being of things in their givenness in that ineradicable "state of departure." A philosophy that gives the last word to the things themselves, a radical phenomenology, doesn't find certainty; rather, it finds "a process of flight, of escape . . . not the final logos . . . but only . . . the veiling and withdraw of being . . . the 'permanent dissonance' of an inarticulate scream. Phenomenology . . . discloses not being but a process of becoming, a dehiscence" (3, 97). That which Whitmoyer calls a philosophy of ontological lateness doesn't seek to present a different way of philosophy capable of achieving certainty or arriving "on time." The "perceptual faith" Merleau-Ponty endorses, according to Whitmoyer, restores to "that which I see before my eyes" the "ineluctable distance and . . . openness to the possibility of being otherwise, . . . of doubt," which cruel thought's demand for certainty "wished . . . to escape . . . for access to that which is never otherwise than what it is " (26). Merleau-Ponty's radical philosophy of ontological lateness, on Whitmoyer's reading, carries the notion of perceptual faith back to its foundation in a view of temporality that establishes this ineluctable "spacing, this écart" (26), this becoming according to which philosophy must admit that "philosophical inquiry is constitutively late" (76). The claim that philosophical reflection is always and inevitably (constitutively, ontologically) late stems, according to Whitmoyer, from Merleau-Ponty's reflections on the things themselves, which reflections lead the latter to a view of "being as becoming" (47, 97, 127-35).

Having developed these points in the middle chapters -- most specifically through close readings of the "Cogito" and "Sense experience" chapters of Phenomenology of Perception -- Whitmoyer presents the central defense of his view of ontological lateness in a chapter on temporality. This chapter is a careful and close reading of the "Temporality" chapter of Phenomenology of Perception, and includes a meticulous exegesis of (1) Merleau-Ponty's reading of Husserl's view of absolute time-constituting consciousness, (2) Heidegger's existential development of the latter, and (3) Merleau-Ponty's similarities to, and differences from, (1) and (2). One needn't agree with all of the details of this rich chapter to agree that it does good work in explaining how Merleau-Ponty's view that "the subject is time" provides promising evidence for a view of ontological lateness. For Whitmoyer, since time itself is a "flow and interruption . . . the dehiscence and differentiation of sense" (115) -- an écart that "we do not encounter . . . in the present or as presence . . . but in the spectacle of what appears in its unreachability . . . in the becoming of thing . . . " (117) -- becoming is always late to being (111). Time's own "eloquence" (109, 112, 113) is its "disarticulation" (111) that nevertheless brings "sense into being" (108-09, 113) and "gives life meaning such as it is" (113).

If I am right that Whitmoyer places the promise of a view of ontological lateness in Merleau-Ponty's philosophy of temporality, then I'm not sure that ontological lateness follows from his account of Merleau-Ponty on time (with which account I largely agree). The notion of time's eloquence, which seems central to the fundamental notion of ontological lateness, seems in tension with the "inarticulate scream" (3) that Whitmoyer claimed a radical phenomenological faithfulness to the things themselves would disclose. Flagging this tension isn't an expression of impatience with apparently inconsistent metaphors. A lot rests on whether or not time and that which it discloses appear or not (i.e., are articulate or remain an inarticulate scream).  For Whitmoyer presents as Merleau-Ponty's antidote to cruel thought the notion of radical phenomenology and perceptual faith rooted in the lateness of becoming to being (that is this ineluctable spacing and écart). If the inarticulate scream is "permanent dissonance . . . dehiscence" (3), and if time itself by its nature is this "dehiscence" (115), then it seems that time is the inarticulate scream. Yet, in its eloquence, time is that from which comes sense and meaning (113). Either time generates sense and meaning or it does not.

Whitmoyer likely would reject such a proto-Parmenidean objection and hold, instead, that time is the root of becoming that "retains its depth and opacity because it never coalesces into the fullness of actuality: it is the explosion of a disintegration on the way and never present . . . the ontological sense of lateness" -- an inarticulate constitutive of the articulate (139-40). If this dehiscence that is "never present" means something like Merleau-Ponty's notion of "a past that never was present" -- yet itself makes (it) possible (for) the present and thus things in the present (extended) experiential field (to appear) -- then that dehiscence "never present" 'appears' phenomenologically before. That is, similar to Derrida's notion of the trace, ontological lateness contends (1) that there is no pure presence of knower to known because (2) there is no pure presence of self to self because (3) there's an absence constitutive of presence -- a (past that) never (was) present that itself has a 'constituting value'. On this way of interpreting Whitmoyer, I can see how we get from the lateness of philosophical reflection to the presence of being. But, insofar as what is last in phenomenological analysis reveals a past (or before) that comes first in the order of being, I am not clear about how time itself produces the fundamental mode of ontological lateness (after) as the lateness of becoming to being.

In some places, Whitmoyer seems to describe ontological lateness in a way quite different from the dehiscence "never present." When he describes Merleau-Ponty's view of time as that which 'appears' as an explosion or dehiscence that is not given in "pure" presence, he seems to present a view of time in which no one of time's moments is privileged (111). When Whitmoyer writes of time itself and the way it conditions the givenness of all phenomena in neither pure absence nor pure presence, time appears as a mixture or self-synthesizing dehiscence. Whitmoyer notes that "thought and the becoming of sense are Ineinander" (150). Playing again on that metaphor from Aristotle's Metaphysics A, Whitmoyer holds that "what we reach toward already has us in hand, what we thought is . . . only the untouchable mist of our being in time . . . our ek-stasis" (150). If Whitmoyer grounds ontological lateness in a view of time as Ineinander -- a "state of two things being embedded inside each other" (209) -- then I can see how we get the lateness of philosophical reflection to the presence of being (because this is something like a punctuality from which we could get no distance except in a delayed (late?) reflection). But I cannot see how time itself as Ineinander produces the fundamental mode of ontological lateness as the lateness of becoming to being (because the becoming is itself on time, as it were, even if the philosophical reflection arising from it never can be).

In the book's conclusion, Whitmoyer returns to his earlier promise to talk about Merleau-Ponty's renewal of philosophy. Whitmoyer applies the philosophy of ontological lateness to a new view of philosophy once again founded on love and not fear or cruel thought. He places Merleau-Ponty's radical view of philosophy in dialogue with Nancy's Touch me not (Noli me tangere). Nancy's work is a postmodern analysis of the appearance of the resurrected Jesus Christ to Mary Magdalen and (doubting) Thomas. These figures function broadly as representative of Whitmoyer's Merleau-Ponty's philosophy of ontological lateness and cruel thought, respectively. Against Whitmoyer's Thomas' "distinctively Cartesian affliction" (160), Mary Magdalen abides the risen Christ's injunction to "touch me not," which injunction Thomas refuses. Thomas will not let go (of his fear, doubt, and the other). Thomas, lacking (perceptual) faith, thus does not love (162) and will not (as Mary does) "let the beloved ascend"; Mary, by contrast, "allows the beloved a distance not to be traversed; she allows for the beloved to die" (161). Whitmoyer provocatively concludes that "what the experience of love teaches us is that if we love, as Mary Magdalen loved Christ, we must allow for the beloved's departure, we must let each other die . . . Love, if it is love and not fear is . . . openness to the grief of withdraw" (164).

This claim that love entails "allowing for the other's decay and disintegration . . . for one's own decay and disintegration" (154) is no "quietism of despair but the necessity of courage and action" (166). Whitmoyer rejects an Augustinian move that "finds solace in the divine, the eternal outside that lies beyond the temporal passage that defines created existence" (15) in favor of the view that "what we are called upon to do, far from giving up, is to live -- in all the contingency, fragility, and difficulty of our world, to live the finitude of human life on Earth and be grateful that there are no gods after all" (167). Still, Mary Magdalen abides Christ's injunction because she believes that Christ ascends to eternal life. Is there a third way, then, between cruel thought and a life that in principle denies transcendence and affirms the Earth?

In any event, Whitmoyer's is a work with many provocative analyses, a work that gives us something we want from philosophy (however we view and do philosophy): it makes us think.