The Philosophy of Perception: Phenomenology and Image Theory

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Lambert Wiesing, The Philosophy of Perception: Phenomenology and Image Theory, Nancy Ann Roth (tr.), Bloomsbury, 2014, 166pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781780937595.

Reviewed by Nico Orlandi, University of California, Santa Cruz


Looking at the history of analytic philosophy of perception we can easily find two recurring issues. One is the investigation of the objects of perception -- for example, whether they are ordinary objects or sense data. The other is the investigation of what the subject needs to do in order to perceive. In this book, Lambert Wiesing proposes that we switch paradigms. Rather than focusing on the object or on the subject of perception (or on both), we should focus on perception itself and on its significance for perceivers. Wiesing understands perception as a "mental state or experience" in which subjects take "a particular, describable object to be present and extant" (p. 76). Given this characterization, he proposes that we focus on what consequences the reality of perception has for a subject, or more pointedly, that we focus on what perception condemns us to.

The answer, according to Wiesing, is that perception condemns us to a physical and embodied existence (p. 106), an existence as subjects that are present and self-identical through space and time (p. 125). Just as the birth of a child makes one a father, the existence of perception makes one a perceiver -- a spatio-temporal and embodied entity that is part of the physical world (p. 75). Importantly, perception condemns us to be more than mere spectators. Perceiving involves participating (p. 101). As perceivers we are public, visible actors (p. 120). The world of perception is itself present and real, in the sense of being a material cause of our experiences that is independent of our consciousness (pp. 80, 116-118).

In this view, perceptions are presentations, and 'presentness' is a distinctive phenomenological quality that distinguishes perceptual states from imagination and from other contemplative mental attitudes (p. 79). If the world of objects did not impose itself on us in perception, then it wouldn't be perception that we are considering (p. 89). Husserlian epoché, or bracketing out of the world, is not a possibility in this context (pp. 92-94). Thinking of perception as a mere objectless sensation is, according to Wiesing, like thinking of triangles that do not have three corners. He maintains that his outlook on perception guarantees a genuine and unmediated being-in-the-world.

Although many of his central claims can be found in contemporary philosophy of cognitive science -- particularly in embodied and situated approaches to mental activity[1] -- Wiesing reaches his conclusions by employing a phenomenological method that may be unfamiliar to philosophers raised in the 'analytic' tradition. This makes the book a stimulating contribution. In what follows, I summarize the book and raise some questions that come precisely from an outsider's perspective on this approach.

The proposal of focusing on the reality of perception -- and on its consequences for perceivers -- is discussed primarily in Chapter 3, which is central to the book. Chapter 1 identifies a critical target. In it, Wiesing presents what he calls the Myth of the Mediate. According to this Myth, "being-in-the-world is a mediated being-in-the-world" (p. 3). A human being possesses points of access to the world, but nothing, either in perception, action or imagination is immediately present to her. Although subjects are not aware of this mediation, their contact with the world of objects is always filtered (p. 21).

The myth of the mediate is widespread in philosophy, according to Wiesing, held in various forms by Hegelians, Kantian, pragmatists, deconstructivists and analytic philosophers of various stripes (p. 3). Its causes are to be found in an attempt to model how perception comes about -- that is, in an attempt to trace the genesis of perception (p. 6). This, according to Wiesing, is misguided and, in fact, all philosophy that attempts to build third-personal models -- in a similar fashion to how science builds models -- is engaging in a dubious enterprise. He argues that such philosophy unreflectively uses the assumptions embedded in its models, when the assumptions should be questioned (p. 14).

To the third-person methodology of scientific or quasi-scientific models, Wiesing contrasts phenomenology. Phenomenology consists roughly in self-reflecting. When a subject self-reflects on her perceptual experience, she is unaware of the genesis of her experience, but she can uncover fundamental and necessary truths about it.

In chapter 2, Wiesing says that self-reflection is a method that makes one's own consciousness immediately accessible (p. 44). Self-reflection brings phenomenal knowledge. This knowledge is better described as certainty (p. 70) and is the basis for doing philosophy without models. Using phenomenal knowledge means concerning oneself only with what is certain. Anything else, according to Wiesing should not be addressed in philosophy at all (p. 47).

Of particular interest is a specific phenomenological method that Wiesing inherits from Husserl and Kant: the method of 'eidetic variation' (p. 65). An eidetic variation consists in consciously reflecting on one's own mental states, for example, on the mental state of perceiving a tomato. In the next step, one fantasizes or imagines variations to this situation as in a thought experiment. Could one, for example, imagine the tomato to be differently colored, differently shaped, not present at all, not in space and time? The goal of this imaginative enterprise is to find the limits of the variation, and presumably, the limits (and essences) of the notions in play. Central to this method is that subjects are encouraged to experience for themselves. Methods that encourage this first-person participation are called 'protreptic' (p. 60).

After applying this methodology to trace what perception condemns us to in chapter 3, chapter 4 closes the book with an interesting discussion of image perception. While ordinary perception forces us to be real participants in the world, viewing images is not as demanding. It allows a pause in participation, where we can afford a more contemplative stance (p. 153). In looking at images, we are the kind of detached spectators that we cannot afford to be when we perceive.

Overall, Wiesing's book nicely uses insights from Husserl's philosophy to draw conclusions about the embodiment and worldiness of perceivers. It is as if Husserl met Merleau-Ponty in this poignant work. By engaging in phenomenological reflection we find ourselves as fully embodied, active participants in the real world.

While I find the positive claims of the book interesting, some of the polemical points are a bit hard to follow and, in my opinion, not sufficiently justified. For example, in chapter 1, Wiesing suggests that philosophers who engage in modeling are doing something that is not just questionable, but also contradictory (p. 12). It is unclear, however, why this is the case, and it is further unclear why modeling a certain mental process -- or trying to understand its origins -- is in any way bad, or to be contrasted with a phenomenological approach.

It is also not clear why philosophy should concern itself only with what is certain. Even granting that phenomenology, self-reflection and eidetic variation deliver indubitable certainty -- something that it would have been interesting to problematize -- I am unsure as to why philosophers should restrict their interest only to this type of certainty.

Similar worries affect Wiesing's discussion of the Myth of the Mediate. Although one can form some vague idea as to what this myth amounts to, there aren't enough specific references in the text to help the reader understand what kind of position is being discussed. Is any paradigm that thinks of perception as involving mental representations, an instance of this myth? Is a view that conceives of perception as an organic and ecological process -- thus as an affair that can be studied third-personally, and 'from the outside' -- also an instance of this myth? Because it is not clear what kind of positions count as belonging to the myth of the mediate, it is also not clear how the shift in paradigm proposed by Wiesing helps.

Consider, for example, the common idea in cognitive science that perceptual processing involves an unconscious interpretation.[2] In what way is this position an instance of the Myth of the Mediate? As Wiesing concedes, proponents of interpretationism tend to admit that interpreting is not something that perceivers are aware of. As a result, interpretationism seems to be compatible with the conclusions Wiesing draws about perception by using phenomenological self-reflection. That an unconscious interpretation is needed for us to reconstruct the appearance of an object from retinal stimulation is compatible with the fact that, in first-person awareness, the object is immediately present. Without some further explanation of what the Myth of the Mediate consists in, it is not clear that the shift in paradigm proposed by Wiesing helps to avoid it.

In addition to finding the polemical points in the book somewhat under-argued, I have questions concerning the method employed by Wiesing. First, it seems that experiential self-reflection and eidetic variation allow him to draw conclusions that are either compatible with some of the positions that he wants to criticize, or orthogonal to some traditional debates in the philosophy of perception. The debate on the nature of the objects of perception, for example, concerns -- at least in part -- whether perceptual objects are the ordinary, physical and material entities that we seem to encounter in perceptual experience.[3] The debate concedes that objects appear as ordinary and material in experience. Yet what is questioned is whether this appearance is correct. It is not clear how a phenomenological approach would help in this context.

Further, it is dubious that the ordinary nature, and the physicality and materiality of objects would even be what we find when we simply reflect on the reality of perception -- even when perception is understood as a state of taking an object to be present and extant (p. 76).

A second question about the method employed by Wiesing concerns the status of the conclusions that are drawn from it. That we are embodied and existing subjects in a real, material world is supposed to be a phenomenally necessary truth. It is an a priori truth and not a mere empirical finding (p. 82). When first reading this, I thought that this kind of position evoked the synthetic a priori that we find in Kant. The idea would be that, by engaging in eidetic variation and in self-reflection, we uncover the conditions for the possibility of perception. But this is not quite consistent with what Wiesing says.

Wiesing talks of the various claims he makes about perception as if they were logical necessities (p. 76) or as if they were concept-analytical truths (p. 80). This is puzzling because the phenomenological method Wiesing uses is tangled up with experiences. The method seems incapable of delivering purely conceptual truths. Self-reflection in perception involves reflecting on experiences. The presence of an object in perception, for example, is a truth based on the manner in which an object is given. The method of eidetic variation has similar experiential elements, as it employs imagination. It seems to then follow that truths derived by these means are not logical or analytic. Indeed, the more general question is how the phenomenological method and the method of eidetic variation relate to pure conceptual analysis. Further clarification would be helpful here.

Throughout the book Wiesing draws connections to various historical figures including Adorno, Ducasse, Husserl, Kant, Merleau-Ponty, Plato, Sartre, Sextus Empiricus, Hippolyte Taine, Richard Wollheim and others. He presents interesting readings of Merleau-Ponty's criticism of Descartes (p. 93), and of Kant's approach in the transcendental aesthetic (p. 64,104-105). Chapter 4, which has been neglected for reasons of space, should be of interest to anyone studying aesthetics and image theory. More generally, philosophers interested in phenomenology and in the situatedness of perception -- particularly from a historical point of view -- should find this book useful and stimulating.


Thanks to my colleagues Dan Guevara, Rasmus Grønfeldt and Samantha Matherne for useful discussion of some of the passages of this book.


Clark, A. (1997). Being there: putting brain, body, and world together again. MIT Press.

Clark, A. "Whatever next? Predictive brains, situated agents, and the future of cognitive science." Behavioral and Brain Sciences 36.03 (2013): 181-204.

Fodor, J. A., and Z. W. Pylyshyn. "How direct is visual perception?: Some reflections on Gibson's 'ecological approach'." Cognition 9.2 (1981): 139-196.

Moore, G. E. "The nature and reality of objects of perception." Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 6 (1905): 68-127.

Orlandi, N. The Innocent Eye: Why Vision is Not a Cognitive Process. Oxford University Press, 2014.

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Rock, I. Indirect perception. MIT Press, 1997.

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Russell, B. The Problems of Philosophy. London: Home University Library, 1912.

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Wilson, R. A. Boundaries of the mind: The individual in the fragile sciences-Cognition. Cambridge University Press, 2004.

[1] For just a few examples, see Clark 1997, Orlandi 2014, Rowlands 1999, Thompson 2007, Wilson 2004.

[2] See, for instance, Clark 2012, Fodor and Pylyshyn 1981, Palmer 1999, Rock 1997. Wiesing discusses this interpretationist idea on p. 23 and following.

[3] Moore 1905 and Russell 1912.