The Philosophy of Poetry

Placeholder book cover

John Gibson (ed.), The Philosophy of Poetry, Oxford University Press, 2015, 253pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199603671

Reviewed by Ole Martin Skilleås, University of Bergen


We all know that according to Plato's Socrates, there has been a long quarrel between philosophy and poetry. However, in recent years philosophers have embraced literature in ways unimaginable just a generation ago. Moral philosophers have mined the grand and not so grand narratives of the masters for what they have to say about matters moral and ethical, and philosophers of language and logic have shown a preference for illustrating their arguments with fictional works. Among the genres of literature, however, some have been more in favour than others, and poetry is not among them. Most of the work in the philosophy of literature, and the use of literature in other areas of philosophy, has been done with reference to works of fiction -- mostly novels. A turn to poetry may well force the generalisations about literature to be reconsidered, perhaps modified, or in some cases abandoned. There are therefore plenty of reasons for philosophy to take a closer look at poetry. John Gibson claims that poetry is the last frontier of analytic aesthetics, and his collection of eleven original articles aims to explore and claim this new territory. He is, however, not the first explorer of it.

Richard Eldridge has done much to bring poetry back within the purview of philosophical aesthetics, but he is seen by Gibson as perhaps not fully analytic and so the generalisation above can still stand. Other important aestheticians in the analytic tradition have also published on poetry since the millennium, such as Peter Kivy and Peter Lamarque, Mark Rowe and Anna Christina Soy Ribeiro. Special editions of the journals Ratio (on literature in general, but with important work on poetry) and Midwest Studies in Philosophy in 2009 (on poetry exclusively) may well have been the watershed moment in this narrative about the late arrival of poetry on the scene. Ernest Lepore's guest editorship of the latter is particularly praiseworthy since it brought out work on poetry from philosophers who, like Lepore, have been largely working outside aesthetics. This, one would think, could help bring poetry closer to concerns outside the arts and aesthetics.

Poetry being 'the last great unexplored frontier' in philosophy would have been inexplicable to ancients, who saw poetry as the mother of all the arts. Since the coming of modernism, however, poetry has turned into something of a special interest. Naïve reading, in the sense of being able to read without special skills, has become almost impossible. But Gibson is not perturbed by this. Frequently encountered characterisations of modern poetry as dense, abstract and opaque could just as well be applied to philosophy, and Gibson thinks this brings poetry closer to its essence, comparing modernist poetry to absolute music.

Let the general picture be what it may, the main question for any collection of articles is whether any of the contributors have anything interesting to say. These contributors include some of the people mentioned above as well as others. Out of the eleven articles only two are close readings of poetry and poems. Let us start with them.

Tzachi Zamir uses a close reading of Milton's Paradise Lost to show that poetry, at least in this case, can provide a uniquely literary or aesthetic route to insight. Poetry articulates knowledge, he argues, and is not subservient to supposedly more elevated modes of insight like philosophy. Nor is the relationship necessarily compensatory. It is difficult to reconstruct Zamir's argument, interwoven as it is with Milton's poetry, but suffice it to say that it shows how an engagement with poetry can uniquely structure an argument that cannot easily be prised apart from the poetry. Philosophy can only host the poem, he says, but cannot use it or narrowly pursue philosophy's own concerns through the poem. He ends on a rather fiery note in appealing for a renewed battle between philosophy and poetry.

Eldridge, in the last essay, explores lyric poetry and its distinctive powers of expression. Using Ingeborg Bachmann's poem 'Böhmen liegt am Meer', he claims that the full expressive power of lyric poetry aims at getting the sense of things and not just an understanding of them. Eldridge shows how this modernist poem, written in 1964 but published in 1968, addresses the nature, function and value of poetry itself, in relation to what it can achieve beyond its own expression. Eldrige is learned, engaged and perceptive, but his prose sometimes tries to do too much at once. Comparing academic prose and poetry is, of course, unfair, but Eldridge's sentences often grow too long and convoluted. The contrast with the poem and its powerful, clear and melodic lines reproduced both in their native German and in English is, however, very striking.

The other articles are more concerned with traditional philosophy and do not go quite so deeply into poems as Eldridge and Zamir. Simon Blackburn asks, tongue in cheek, 'Can an Analytic Philosopher Read Poetry?' His theme is 'the relationship of poetry to language, and thence to analytic philosophy'. His suspicion is that philosophers (and here he no doubt means analytic philosophers) only read poetry by leaving some of their philosophy behind, but he feels the need to clear up a misunderstanding about analytic philosophy.

This misunderstanding turns out to be that analytic philosophers are preoccupied with definition and precision -- an activity and a quality far from the concerns of most poets. However, much of our professional activity as philosophers turns out to be exegesis, and therefore most philosophers should be well equipped to turn to poetry. But why should analytic philosophers do so? Much philosophy of language is conducted within what Blackburn calls 'the Fregean paradigm' -- single sentences conveying propositions from one mind to another. Poetry, however, can challenge the all too prevalent simplifications in the philosophy of language. Blackburn fails to say anything of interest about poetry, but could perhaps be read as proposing a new direction in the philosophy of language when he writes that 'a poetic sensitivity . . . is unquestionably our best guide to who we are, and even to where we ought to be heading'. Then again, it could be that 'we' in this sentence is just humanity as such, and if so, an opportunity to say something interesting and new has been missed.

In Roger Scruton's contribution the relation or opposition between poetry and truth comes in for renewed discussion. Scruton here aims to show that 'the essence of poetry is the founding of truth' -- a view he takes from Heidegger in The Origin of the Work of Art. Heidegger's concept of truth, of course, is somewhat different from the concepts we know from logic or the philosophy of language. Scruton sees Heidegger's aletheia as a secular version of religious conceptions of truth -- that the truth is that seen by God when things are at rest in their essences. By attributing this process to poetry, Heidegger advocates revelation without God.

Scruton sets about his defense with a laudable aim to first define poetry, and it is the poetic use of language that is the key. Crucial to this use is that connections are left to be made in the mind of the reader, and Scruton is well aware that this makes many works of prose examples of the poetic use of language. The converse is also true since many works of poetry do not employ the poetic use of language. While the crucial feature of prose is its aboutness, the poetic utterance is to be understood non-intentionally. The effect of poetry depends on its way of showing what is told.

Scruton backs up his assertions with examples and arguments, but it would take too much space to summarise them here. What strikes me is the way he manages to exemplify and make Heidegger's semi-messianic assertions credible and important, but more than a little of Heidegger's spirit is left in passages such as: 'Poetry transfigures what it touches, so that it is revealed in another way . . . the unconcealing of what is . . . hidden from us' (154).

There is no space to go into detail for the remaining papers, but they all deserve a mention. Ronald de Sousa explores the similarities and dissimilarities between poet and philosopher. However, he emphasises the similarities and finds that both have a problematic relationship with language and both are concerned with truth and in providing new perspectives. For Jesse Prinz and Eric Mandelbaum opacity is the central concern, and they thoroughly explore the various aspects of opacity involved in poetry.

Angela Leighton's 'Poetry's Knowing: So What Do We Know?' puts particular emphasis on the poet's tentative approach to knowledge and understanding. Comparing poetry and philosophy, the upshot is that the ways of each preclude some ways of knowing at the same time as others are opened up. Alison Denham's article deals with the epistemic and moral significance of the kind of imaginative experience poetry offers; she particularly scrutinses Paul Celan's Psalm .

Sherri Irvin's concern is unreadable poems, which turn out not to be so unreadable after all. Her article presents several techniques for how the apparently senseless can speak to us, and this in a way that is intersubjectively available. The case for poetry being meaningless here gets a good drubbing.

Ribeiro is one of very few philosophers who have worked almost exclusively on poetry. Her 'The Spoken and the Written: An Ontology of Poems' shows how poetry presents particular problems for the ontology of literary works. Working within modern metaphysics, she emphasises in particular that poetry is not only a written art but a spoken art as well. Her emphasis on cultural and historical practices makes it evident that a generic ontology of literary works cannot be provided.

Practice is also a key concept in Lamarque's 'Semantic Finegrainedness and Poetic Value'. It's the last article I will mention but the first in the collection. We have seen that some of the other contributions address, and even praise, compression, complexity and opacity. But why should this kind of writing, while shunned in most other areas, be valuable in a genre of literature? This is the principal question Lamarque addresses, and to focus the discussion he invokes four commonplaces about poetry. These can be briefly mentioned without further explanation as the heresy of paraphrase, semantic density, the unity of form and content, and the unique experience of poetry. They are all related, according to Lamarque, and mutually supportive. They all add up to our expectation of poetry as art and are thus not something we somehow discover in poetry but rather something we demand of it.

Readers familiar with the work of Lamarque and Stein Haugom Olsen will know that they advocate a convention-governed institutional theory of literature, and Lamarque firmly and cogently advocates that theory here. By switching the perspective from what poetry is to how poetry is, Lamarque can argue that 'metaphor' and 'poetic language' are inadequate and misunderstood indications of 'the poetic'. The four commonplaces about poetry capture some of the shared rules and norms constitutive of poetry as a practice. We value qualities in poetry that we would bemoan elsewhere because they are part of the shared conception of poetry and because -- at the end of the day -- we have come to value the experiences to be had through the extra effort.

All in all, this is a useful and stimulating collection of some of the best current work on poetry from a mostly philosophical perspective.