The Philosophy of Praxis: Marx, Lukács and the Frankfurt School

Placeholder book cover

Andrew Feenberg, The Philosophy of Praxis: Marx, Lukács and the Frankfurt School, Verso, 2014, 252pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781781681725.

Reviewed by Timo Jütten, University of Essex


This is a thoroughly revised version of Andrew Feenberg's first book, Lukács, Marx and the Sources of Critical Theory (1981).[1] In the Preface to the new version Feenberg writes that he often has looked back to the original version, based on his doctoral dissertation supervised by Herbert Marcuse, "with a mixture of pride and dismay" (viii). On the one hand, Feenberg is proud of the fact that the original volume has helped people understand the complicated arguments of Lukács' History and Class Consciousness. On the other hand, he has long recognized that there were problems with the original version, and in this new one he aims to solve these problems. As someone who has profited from the original volume in the way that justly gives Feenberg pride, I am happy to report that the new version is a very worthy successor and will be indispensable for a new generation of students and scholars as they try to make sense of the intellectual background of Frankfurt School critical theory.

The book can be divided into three parts. Feenberg devotes three chapters each to Marx's early writings and to Lukács' History and Class Consciousness (including some discussion of his recently published defense of this controversial book), and two chapters on how members of the Frankfurt School, in particular Adorno and Marcuse, have taken up and transformed their legacies. There also is a substantial conclusion and an Appendix, which condenses two chapters from the earlier version. Feenberg has thoroughly revised the book throughout. For example, there is a new discussion of the influence of the neo-Kantians on Lukács (e.g., 73-78), a more extended discussion of the Kantian and Hegelian background, and a new focus on the critique of science and technology, which became an important theme in Feenberg's work following the publication of his first book. Finally, the two chapters on the Frankfurt School are all new. I won't be able to do justice to all of this material, so will focus on what I consider to be the book's major strengths.

Students of Frankfurt School critical theory often are confronted with an approach to philosophy that is very alien to the mainstream but can be rendered intelligible, if its Marxist and Lukácsian background is brought to the fore. For example, consider the cryptic opening sentence of Adorno's Negative Dialectics: "Philosophy, which once seemed obsolete, lives on, because the moment of its realization was missed."[2] It is with understanding sentences like these that Feenberg's book really helps. Both the obsolescence of philosophy and its possible realization are problems that arise in Marx's early writings and in Lukács' History and Class Consciousness, in the context of a philosophy of praxis that aims to overcome the antinomies identified by modern philosophy through collective social action and to realize the level of rationality that has been attained through theoretical reflection in social practices and institutions. For Marx and for Lukács (who didn't know Marx's early writings when he wrote History and Class Consciousness in 1923 but developed very similar arguments), the German idealist tradition had reached an impasse in Hegel, who thought that the antinomies of modern philosophy had to be resolved by speculative thought. In contrast, Marx and Lukács believed that these antinomies ultimately could not be resolved either critically, as Kant thought, or speculatively, as Hegel thought, but only metacritically. Such a metacritique of philosophy would amount to a "sociological desublimation of the concepts of philosophy" (12). It would demonstrate that seemingly philosophical problems are rooted in social reality, and that only social change will resolve the antinomies. Feenberg's discussion of Lukács' metacritique of philosophy in Chapter Five is particularly insightful. As he explains,

For Lukács, traditional philosophy is in essence philosophy of culture that does not know itself as such. Philosophy reflects on cultural structures -- forms of objectivity -- that it misinterprets as eternal principles disconnected from the accidents of history and social life. (91)

Lukács' discussion applies this insight to a practical and a theoretical antinomy. Considered from a practical perspective, the antinomial conflict between freedom and determinism characterizes the social experience of modern subjects in their everyday lives. Forty years later Adorno would make the same point in his lectures on Kant and in Negative Dialectics.[3] Subjects face a practical antinomy, because their inner sense of agency and freedom is incompatible with the social determinism that they experience as a natural law in modern capitalist society. According to Lukács, Kant's moral philosophy reflects this antinomy, but its proposed resolution, the distinction between the phenomenal and noumenal realms, reifies moral freedom and cannot explain how the free subject can act in a world that is governed by the seemingly natural laws of economics. Considered from a theoretical perspective, the antinomial conflict is generated by two incompatible philosophical commitments that concern the nature of our knowledge of reality. On the one hand, the subject stands in a contemplative, passive relationship to the world when it seeks to control it. The world is governed by natural laws that exist independently of the empirical subject, and the subject must comprehend these laws in order to dominate nature. Thus, "the reified is the rational" (97). On the other hand, the subject stands in an active relationship to its world. As a transcendental subject it creates the world by imposing the form of reason onto it, and the intelligibility of the world to the subject is explained by this imposition. Lukács traces the philosophical attempts to reconcile these commitments from Kant to Hegel, but, ultimately, he argues that such a reconciliation requires a change of perspective that overcomes the dualism of humanity and nature, history and ontology.

Both the early Marx and Lukács attempt such a reconciliation, and Feenberg devotes Chapters Three and Six to these attempts. These are important parts of the book, because Feenberg grapples with problems in Marx's and Lukács' thought that long have perplexed commentators. The question is whether either operates with a concept of subject-object identity, which denies the ontological independence of nature. Thus Marx seems to argue that humans produce nature through their labour, and that, therefore, "under the appropriate social conditions it will be possible to recognize the essence of nature as human activity" (44). As Feenberg points out, this argument is implausible, because nature is not just raw material for human labour, and labour is not the only way in which humans engage with nature. In any case, Marx abandoned this whole line of thought in his writings immediately following the Manuscripts. Lukács often has been criticized for a similar approach to nature, and Feenberg offers a detailed analysis of History and Class Consciousness that aims to show the mistakes in these criticisms. In particular, he disposes of the "absurd" thesis that nature "is a purely social category, and the natural world therefore has no independence of humanity and human understanding" (129), by showing that Lukács actually talks about our knowledge of nature, rather than about nature itself. Moreover, Feenberg tries to show that Lukács is not committed to the implausible view that there is a specifically capitalist science that is reified and would be replaced by a communist science after the revolution. As I understand Feenberg's argument, science and technology always progress through a dialectic of reification and de-reification. To be sure, under capitalism the reifying aspects of science and technology, which undermine our lived experience of nature, are foregrounded due to capitalism's "formal bias" (145; cf. 166) in favour of an abstract and disembodied approach to nature that focuses on its domination and exploitation. But it is a mistake to believe that a "communist science" would not be reifying. The reification of nature in science differs from the reification of society.

This is an original way of solving a problem that has been discussed in the literature on Lukács and the Frankfurt School.[4] However, it also raises new questions, to which Feenberg could have devoted more space. For example, one may ask how exactly reification comes about and what its relationship is to market exchange in capitalist societies, given that reification and de-reification now seem to be necessary moments of social practice. I think that the concept of formal bias could potentially be extremely fruitful in answering these questions, but it remains underdeveloped in this book.

In Chapters Seven and Eight Feenberg turns to the Frankfurt School, which inherits the legacy of the philosophy of praxis from Marx and Lukács but differs from them on two very important points. First, Adorno and Marcuse place central importance on the domination of nature as a source of social pathologies that affect modern subjects. Second, they formulate their critical theories of society at a time when the "unity of theory and practice" has broken down, that is, when it has become clear that the proletariat in Western Europe is not on the verge of staging a revolution to overthrow capitalism. Of course, Adorno's and Marcuse's theories are very different. Feenberg characterizes this difference in terms of the concepts that they inherit from Marx and Lukács. Whereas Adorno takes the theory of commodity fetishism as his starting point, Marcuse's emphasizes the experience of alienation (158, 175). Feenberg's discussion of Adorno suggests that he considers him an outlier in the philosophy of praxis. His negativistic philosophy eschews the appeal to concepts such as emancipation, progress or revolution. Instead, Adorno uses the concept of reification in order to explain why no such appeal is possible. His criticism of identity thinking demonstrates the reification of reason in capitalist society, but it abstains from formulating a positive alternative. As Feenberg puts it, negative dialectics "does not resolve the antinomies but rather identifies them as such and suspends all premature resolutions. It is the logic of immanent critique and not a constructive alternative" (155).

I found Feenberg's discussion of Adorno the least satisfying. Perhaps it is unsurprising that a volume devoted to the philosophy of praxis will find Adorno's approach wanting, but once it is included, it may be worthwhile to explain in more detail what exactly Adorno thought the prospects for political action were, and why he thought that they were so restricted.[5]

Feenberg's discussion of Marcuse is much more sympathetic; he emerges as the true heir of the philosophy of praxis in whose work "the Frankfurt School returns to its sources" (155). More specifically, Marcuse returns to the problem of the reconciliation of humanity and nature. To this end, he elaborates a dereifying attitude, which reveals a dimension of lived nature that is occluded in the merely instrumental attitude that is characteristic of modern subjects who fear nature and aim to dominate it. This dereified dimension includes aspects of nature such as aesthetic beauty and potentialities of development that Marcuse conceives of as objective. The purpose of Marcuse's critical theory is to explain how the restricted instrumental rationality in modern societies prevents modern subjects from having access to this dimension of nature. The liberation of humans and that of nature go hand in hand. It is only once we are freed from capitalism, considered not only as an economic system but also as a comprehensive worldview (180), that we will be free to relate to nature in a non-dominating way. As is well known, Marcuse was much more optimistic than Adorno about the potential for political action to achieve such liberation. Feenberg sides with Marcuse on this question and argues for a conception of social change that does not put its hopes in revolution as it is traditionally conceived but in small-scale local resistance to domination that can create spaces of freedom (219­-20). This is partly motivated by the recognition that no large-scale revolution is on the horizon, but also by Feenberg's insight that reification cannot be overcome by a revolutionary event but rather needs to be combatted permanently through ongoing practice.

In conclusion, Feenberg's book is admirable in the clarity that it brings to one of the most complex strands of Marxist thought. It defends the viability of the philosophy of praxis approach and connects it to current concerns about science and technology. I recommend it to everyone interested in these topics or in the intellectual background of Frankfurt School critical theory.

[1] Andrew Feenberg, Lukács, Marx and the Sources of Critical Theory (Totowa NJ, Rowman and Littlefield, 1981; paperback edition, Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press, 1986).       

[2] Theodor W. Adorno, Negative Dialektik (Frankfurt: Suhrkamp 1966), p. 15 (my translation).

[3] For Adorno’s interpretation of this Antinomy see my "Adorno on Kant, Freedom and Determinism", European Journal of Philosophy 20:4 (2012): 548-74.

[4] See, for example, Steven Vogel, Against Nature: The Concept of Nature in Critical Theory (Albany NY: SUNY Press, 1996).

[5] For more on this see Fabian Freyenhagen, Adorno’s Practical Philosophy. Living Less Wrongly (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2013) and his "Adorno’s Politics: Theory and Praxis in Germany’s 1960s", Philosophy & Social Criticism 40:9 (2014): 867-93.