The Philosophy of Race

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Albert Atkin, The Philosophy of Race, Acumen, 2012, 192pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781844655151.

Reviewed by Tina Fernandes Botts, University of North Carolina, Charlotte


Albert Atkin sets out to analyze our ordinary concept of race through the lens of "mainstream" philosophy, a task he implies has as yet not been attempted. His goal is to discover what a philosophical account of race might add to the study of race that other disciplines (such as sociology, psychology, history, ethnic studies, and presumably non-"mainstream" philosophy as well) have as yet not brought to the table. For Atkin, that addition turns out primarily to be a higher level of precision and clarity. His suggestion is that if that precision and clarity can be brought to the study of race, then policy questions involving racial dimensions will be more easily resolved. To test this, Atkin spends the first four chapters cataloguing and categorizing the main themes, ideas, and concepts that already exist in non-"mainstream" philosophy and other disciplines on the topic of race. He then applies the taxonomy he develops to the policy question of whether racial profiling can ever be justified. It turns out that it can't, but this is no surprise.

Atkin succeeds in creating a taxonomy of contemporary race theory, and in translating existing ideas in contemporary race theory into a language and format that "mainstream" philosophers can understand. His book would work well as a primer for "mainstream" philosophers on the key ideas in the study of race and on the conceptual differences among these ideas. Where Atkin fails, unfortunately, is in adding anything substantively new to the existing work on race and racism. Still, his very attempt to produce a work of "mainstream" philosophy exclusively dedicated to studying the concept of race (and its relationship to racism) is a step forward from the perspective of the critical philosophy of race. Also to his credit, Atkin asks why the concept of race has not been given greater ("mainstream") philosophical attention, given the philosophical richness of the concept. He then admirably brings to "mainstream" philosophy's attention the suggestion that the answer to this question may lie in the philosopher's habit of abstracting out detail.  Atkin writes "within a general practice of abstracting away certain kinds of detail, race has frequently found itself sidelined" (5). Noting that philosophy's rather habitual sidelining of the concept of race is falling under increasing scrutiny, Atkin says philosophers should engage with the concept of race not only because the concept is philosophically rich but also because "it might do philosophy well, as a discipline, to reflect upon its "whiteness" (5), that is, to "diminish the whiteness of [its] philosophical gaze" (6).

For Atkin, it is of preliminary importance in a ("mainstream") philosophical account of the concept of race to determine whether race is real. To answer this question, he first describes our ordinary, every-day, "pre-theoretical" concept of race, then attempts to make that concept more philosophically robust. After that, he assesses whether the more philosophically robust concept of race has any support from science, particularly biology. He discovers that there is little support for the ordinary concept of race within science, even when it is made more philosophically robust, and concludes on this basis that in an important sense, race is not real. Atkin argues that a foundational aspect of our ordinary concept of race is that we assume race is real and that the reality of race is underpinned by biological and genetic facts. We talk, think, and behave as if there are things in the world called races that have a basis in science. The problem with this assumption on our part, however, is that the kinds of things the word 'race' picks out in the world is altogether unclear. That we behave as if there are races is only a fact about our behavior, not about race itself, in other words. To get a better handle on the kinds of things the word 'race' picks out in the world (rather than on what we assume about those kinds of things), it is helpful to first identify a list of key themes underlying our ordinary concept of race and then to subject these themes to philosophical scrutiny.

The six key themes of our ordinary concept of race are (1) that the central markers of race are bodily ("somatic") traits, (2) that race is inherited, (3) that racial differences are tied to geographical origins, (4) that race marks off certain physical or mental capacities, (5) that different races have different "cultural and attitudinal behaviors," and (6) that races involve the notion of purity. According to Atkin, it turns out that the most credible of the key themes in our ordinary concept of race are somatic traits, inheritance, and the idea that racial differences are tied to geographical origins. If we subject these three most credible themes to an additional level of philosophical scrutiny by inquiring into whether science supports the usage of any of these themes to identify racial categories, however, it turns out that none of the themes survives philosophical scrutiny. On this basis, Atkin ends chapter 1 by concluding that if we define race in terms of our ordinary, common usage, race is not real.

In any event, having concluded that our ordinary concept of race is not real, Atkin then sets out in to determine whether race has a social reality, and if so what the content of that social reality might look like. An important feature of the social reality of race, for Atkin, is that "there are differences in how race is identified, thought of and talked about in different societies and social settings" (52). To support this conclusion, he compares the socio-historical practices, behaviors, conventions, and institutions that gave rise to the concept of race at work in the United States with the same socio-historical practices that gave rise to the concept of race at work in Brazil. In the United States, Atkin links the rise of concept of race to the "massive importation of (African) slave labor into the Americas" (52), even before the nation's founding. "Imported along with these slaves," writes Atkin, "was the attitude that the division of people into races was both natural and scientifically endorsable" as well as the view that "races could be seen hierarchically with the white race considered superior to the black race" (52). Then, once present in the United States, racial concepts changed over time in response to changing social conditions. Atkins points out that "as the categories [of race] became harder to police in antebellum USA, new categories were introduced, removed, reclassified and legislated for" (53). Thus, for example, as the population of Hispanic Americans grew in the 1970s and as multiracial identity became more popular, the new racial categories of Latino/Hispanic and bi-racial or multi-racial were added to the United States census.

The development of the concept of race in Brazil has been different than in the United States, according to Atkin, primarily owing to a crucial difference in the relative numbers of blacks and whites, to the existing infrastructures, and to the needs and interests of the ruling white elite in both countries. While in the United States (where 80% of the population was white), there were plenty of white candidates available for "intermediate social groupings" between the ruling and slave classes (such as military personnel, forepersons of guards for slave plantations, farmers, or any of the jobs and tasks forbidden to slaves), in Brazil this was not the case. Instead, according to Atkin, when Brazil gained independence from Portugal in 1822 it is estimated that as many as three million of its population of four million were of African (or mixed African) descent. What sprang up in Brazil as a result was "an elaborate color based system of racial classification" that has included as many as twenty-eight different racial categories. The intermediate social groups took on the various roles that whites were too few to fill and blacks were too socially restricted to be permitted to fill. In other words, since such a large majority of the Brazilian population was of African descent, both the "one drop rule" (also known as the rule of "hypodescent," according to which someone is considered "black" in virtue of having even one distant African ancestor) so prevalent in the United States and the white privilege the "one drop rule" was designed to preserve were socially useless phenomena in Brazil; and hence did not exist there.

For Atkin, this stark contrast between the concepts of race in the United States and in Brazil demonstrates that there is a significant socio-historical aspect to our concept of race and the way we think and talk about it. Taking himself to have established this socio-historical aspect of race, Atkin then suggests that there are at least three different "attitudes" one can adopt with regard to this reality: (1) strong social constructionism, (2) weak social constructionism, and (3) reconstructionism. All three acknowledge the significance of socio-historical practices to the concept of race. Proponents of both forms of social constructionism are concerned primarily with whether the socio-historical practices that give rise to race make race real or objective (proponents of strong social constructionists say yes while proponents of weak social constructionism say no). Proponents of reconstructionism, however, are more concerned with the way we can use the concept of race in the service of certain social processes or ends.

That race has no biological reality, but nevertheless does indeed have a social reality, has been well-established in philosophy for many years now. Whatever method Atkin uses to arrive at this conclusion, then, his philosophical work seems unnecessary. It is also unclear why Atkin's methods of analysis qualify, in his view, as more "mainstream" than the methods of rational deduction and inference that other, non-"mainstream" philosophers before Atkin have used to arrive at the same conclusion.

In any event, given that our ordinary concept of race turns out not to point to anything real, but that there is nevertheless a socio-historical reality to it, Atkin next asks what we should do with the concept of race. He identifies three general ways of approaching this normative question: eliminativism, preservationism, and reconstructionism. Eliminativists argue that we should abandon our race thought and talk since science shows that race cannot be a biological kind, since the weak social constructivist position on the social reality of race makes the most sense (i.e., the socio-historical aspects of race are not enough to be reality conferring), and since the race labels and practices currently in practice are divisive, negative, and socially destructive. Although many preservationists agree with eliminativists that race cannot be a biological kind, they argue, by contrast, that we should nevertheless retain the concept of race since the strong social constructivist position on the social reality of race makes the most sense (i.e., the socio-historical aspects of race are enough to be reality conferring), and since the concept of race does have social utility. Race, for many preservationists, while not a biological kind is certainly a social kind. Atkin presents the reconstructionist position as relatively new (emerging in the last ten years or so) and as an attempt to move away from the more classical eliminativist/preservationist debate. For the reconstructionist, according to Atkin, what we should do with the concept of race is reconstruct it.

For example, some reconstructionists suggest reconstructing race to mean something more like ethnicity. Others suggest a focus on the process of racialization (the assigning of races to people) instead of on race. "Instead of describing someone as 'black,' we would describe them [sic] as 'racialized as black in our society'" (103). Still other reconstructionists advocate what is known as an "ameliorative definitional project," according to which those concerned about the concept of race would first consider what work the concept of race should do before deciding how to define it. For example, one thing the concept might do is help to overcome injustice or redress inequalities. The final reconstructionist position considered by Atkin is what he calls a "substitutionist" account of race, according to which our ordinary concept of race would be replaced with a "fully socially constructed race" (108), which would add to strong social constructivism "altering the world to reflect the apparent meaningfulness of our race thought and talk" (108). Atkin explains: "the idea is that we can introduce a new way of thinking and talking about race that embraces the socio-historical elements as wholly and solely reality conferring" (108).

Atkin's implication is that the reconstructionist approach makes the most sense, but he does not come out and say this. Instead, he describes the eliminativist and preservationist positions as existing at opposite theoretical poles and the reconstructionist position as a more sensible compromise. But, if the reconstructionist position is examined more closely, it is revealed as nothing more than strong social constructionism used in service of social and political ends. In this way, Atkin's philosophical work again appears unnecessary.

Having, as he sees it, fully examined the concept of race at this point, Atkin sets out to provide a philosophical account of the concept of racism. He begins by defining racism as

the assumption of the existence of races with relations of superiority and inferiority existing between them, such that the presumed superior group is able to dominate and exercise power over the dominated group to the detriment and disadvantage of members of that group qua members of that group. (116)

He then spends the rest of the chapter adding additional levels of detail. Specifically, he identifies and distinguishes: overt (known and acknowledged) versus avert (hidden and denied) racism; direct versus indirect racism; individual versus institutional racism ("the mechanisms of social control through which we manage society are inherently oppressive and detrimental to the lives and prospects of people of particular races" (119); cultural racism ("racism without racists" (120) or "the idea that we frequently see racial prejudice treated as though it belongs to a past age, and current racial inequalities explained in terms of deep cultural differences" (120); internalized racism; and symbolic racism.

Atkins holds that there are also a number of philosophical accounts of racism. He describes three: (1) the "belief/ideology model" of racism (the idea that it is racist beliefs and racist ideology that form necessary and sufficient conditions for racism), (2) a "behavioral model of racism (the idea that behaviors and actions that have detrimental outcomes are to be the focus of the necessary and sufficient conditions for something to be racist), and (3) an "affective model of racism" (the idea that the presence of negative feeling or malevolent motivations gives us the basis of necessary and sufficient conditions for racism). But, Atkin concludes that none of the three philosophical accounts of racism sufficiently accounts for the empirical facts about racism provided by sociologists and psychologists, which include that racism often operates in two or more of these ways or sometimes all three at once. Atkin speculates, "we might question whether we are being too ambitious in wanting to give a unified [philosophical] account of racism at all" (140).

If racism is too complex, changing and multifaceted a phenomenon to be captured by a single, unifying account, perhaps there are less restrictive strategies for describing racism, continues Atkin. In response to this challenge, he suggests we should try to develop "hybrid accounts" of racism. One such is the "cognitive-behavioral" account. According to one form of this, "we should combine some cognitive element, such as a belief in races and racial hierarchy, with a behavioral element such as an act, an omission or an attempt based on one's racial belief" (141) to describe racism. According to another "hybrid" account, it might be better to "look deeper and see if there is something more basic that both unifies the various accounts we have mentioned and captures more of the phenomenon of racism than we have been previously been able to" (141). Atkin includes in this second group of hybrid accounts "racism as disregard" and "racism as disrespect." The defining aspect of these accounts, for Atkin, is that "we can treat something as being racist if, and only if, it is disrespectful towards or disregarding of people of a certain race qua members of that racial group" (142). Once again, Atkin's philosophical work seems unnecessary. That the defining aspect of racism is that it involves disregard and disrespect is hardly a surprise; and it is unclear why it was necessary for Atkin to list all of the various kinds and types of racism before he arrived at this conclusion.

The rubber hits the road in the final chapter, where Atkin attempts to bridge the gap between the philosophical accounts of race and racism he has developed, and questions of social policy. First, he aptly points to several areas where the relationship between conceptual clarity on the topics of race and racism might help solve social policy issues. In the area of hate speech, for example, Atkin asks, "What is it that makes these unacceptable terms wrong?" (i.e., racial epithets versus the term "black" or "African American") since "Both pejorative and non-pejorative terms refer, putatively at least, to the same things?" In the area of procreative liberty, he asks how medical professionals might deal with circumstances in which parents of color wish to conceive and give birth to a white child. "Exactly what should medical professionals do in these circumstances?" asks Atkin, since "the ethical and legal implications of being able to select the race of our offspring are deeply interesting, and made even more so when we introduce factors about the reality of race" (146). Or, what should medical professionals do if offered organ donations that come with what seem to be racist provisos? According to Atkin, if the cases are instances of racism, there seem to be good reasons for refusing the offer. On the other hand, there is a corresponding medical duty to save lives, Atkin states. Racism is "odious and immoral," but how does or should our moral stance on it interact with other moral and ethical considerations? He suggests that the element of race involved in certain policy questions may turn out to result in mere "inconveniences" to members of racial minority groups rather than causing them real harm, particularly when compared to the benefits to society that might result from a given racially infused social policy. In these cases, according to Atkin, considering race would seem justified.

To provide a specific instance of how philosophy might help answer these sorts of social policy questions, Atkin uses the example of racial profiling. The first step, according to Atkin, is to develop a "philosophically interesting" account of racial profiling, i.e., one that is conceptually clear. He begins with identifying the "obviously bad" features of our common understanding of racial profiling and then teases out what makes those features bad. What is obviously bad about racial profiling is that "the tool used to connect a particular (racial) characteristic with a particular profile often seems to be suspect or inappropriate in some way" (151). "Here the shopkeeper is using a kind of unofficial racial profiling based on some stereotype that black people are thieves and criminals," (151) Atkin writes. Another obviously bad feature of racial profiling is the possibility for abuse. A third feature of obviously bad racial profiling is "when it is disproportionate," says Atkin (151). If the majority of police attention is spent on stopping persons "of a particular race, R, which is profiled as driving unlicensed," says Atkin, just because the statistical analysis shows the connection between "being of race R" and committing the offense is very clear, then the people "of a particular race, R" who are stopped are being asked to bear a burden which looks unacceptable. So, if a kind of racial profiling could be developed that neither uses inaccurate or appropriate tools, nor is abused, nor is used disproportionately, then Atkin reasons, this would constitute an acceptable kind of racial profiling. He calls this new and improved racial profiling the "good" kind, or a kind of racial profiling "purged" from any obvious racism (155).

The next step in examining racial profiling philosophically, according to Atkin, is to take our new "good racial profiling" and determine if it would result in any "unacceptable harms" (155). The harms of racial profiling, he says, can come from two sources: "(1) the invocation of race and racial identity as the basic indicating characteristic in our profile, and (2) the burden of having special attention called to a particular group qua racial group as part of the application of our profiling practice" (156). Atkin states that the first type of harm is probably unacceptable, although there may be an argument that this kind of racial profiling is acceptable. He thinks the case is stronger that the second type of harm is acceptable. "Refusing to use racial profiling on these grounds," he writes, "would be at the cost of the social benefits to be had from reducing certain kinds of crime, and would do nothing to reduce the harms of racism either" (159). We grasp his point particularly if we bear in mind that we are talking about "good racial profiling."

Having provided the philosophical case for "good" racial profiling, Atkin then sets out to present the philosophical case against it. He identifies three harms that likely render even "good racial profiling" unacceptable. First, a well established result of racial profiling is "internalized racism," meaning that the practice inculcates negative feelings against oneself in racial minorities, resulting in self-limiting behaviors and the undermining of flourishing. Second, racial profiling "seems to draw an official and explicit connection between people of a particular race and particular social problems such as crime" (162), with the result -that certain (false) characteristics about race and the characteristics of particular races are endorsed "that arguably lead to racism" (162). Third, even good racial profiling, i.e., racial profiling that "accords with our strictures on abuse and proportion" is likely to exacerbate racism and certain racial inequalities by virtue of the fact that it takes place against the backdrop of a racist and race-conscious society" (163). Examples of the fact that we live in such a society are that research shows, says Atkin, that Americans (whether black or white) respond to black faces as though there is a threat, and that people misidentify objects as firearms more frequently when they are shown black faces beforehand.

Based on all of this, Atkin suggests that "the harms of racial profiling that arise from the nature of profiling itself may actually be more damaging than simple inconvenience when it comes to the inclusion of race" (167), and concludes that if the previous arguments are right, even good racial profiling cannot be justified. To make matters worse for racial profiling, he adds at the end of the final chapter, "racial profiling could quite easily create feedback loops which make it, in a sense, self-fulfilling" (168). If statistics show that members of a particular race are more likely to commit street crimes after dark, then innocent members of those races are likely to withdraw from behaviors that subject them to police attention, with the result that "those members of a profiled racial group who the police do come in contact with will perhaps become increasingly likely to have committed the crime the police are checking for" so that the connection between race and crime upon which the profiling relies will be strengthened. "All of this looks bad for racial profiling," Atkin concludes (169).

Atkin concludes that racial profiling is probably not a good thing, and the reader is left wondering whether this is as unsurprising a result to Atkin as it is to the reader. If so, the reader is left wondering if Atkin regrets having developed his taxonomy of race at all. His stated purpose for writing the book, after all, was to apply mainstream philosophical methods to the analysis of the concept of race to determine if these methods could add anything new to the resolution of racially-infused policy questions. Since we already knew that racial profiling was probably not a good thing and since Atkin's taxonomy merely confirms this fact, it would appear that philosophical methods cannot add anything new. If, on the other hand, Atkin is surprised by the conclusion that racial profiling is probably not a good thing, the reader is left wondering in what cave Atkin has been living for the past twenty years. Either way, the application of mainstream philosophical methods to the study of race seems to have done no work. Those who, for some time, have been studying the concept of race in non-mainstream philosophical venues will not be surprised by this result. As Atkins himself identifies at the start of the book, "mainstream" philosophy, with its tendency to high abstraction, in some important sense almost cannot grapple responsibly with a concept as messy and affected by lived experience and socio-historical context as the concept of race. Nevertheless, what Atkin's book does well is pull together in one place, order, categorize, and catalogue the key contemporary ideas in the philosophy of race, and for that reason, operates as a useful reference tool for contemporary race theorists.