The Philosophy of Sartre

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Anthony Hatzimoysis, The Philosophy of Sartre, Acumen, 2011, 142pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780773539396.

Reviewed by A. Janae Sholtz, Alvernia University


In the preface to The Philosophy of Sartre, Anthony Hatzimoysis acknowledges the difficulty in finding an entrance into Sartre's corpus, a "reliable compass through the sea of Sartrean volumes", thereby explaining his decision to focus solely on Sartre's own work, rather than situating him within the history of philosophic debate or genres. Each of the six chapters of the book develops a theme designed to "introduce the reader to the Sartrean way of thinking about reality." Hatzimoysis claims that these themes: nausea, intentionality, the ego, emotion, imagining and Being, are presupposed for continuing an investigation of Sartre, giving the novice a foundation to securely proceed. While this sentiment is creditable, two problems arise. Due to this circumspection, Hatzimoysis' analysis remains primarily within the early writings through Being and Nothingness (1936-1943), problematic in that later Sartre notoriously changes and even denounces elements of his early work. Second, the choice of subject matter suggests a predilection for philosophical problems that are amenable to philosophy of mind, reflecting a trend in analytic appropriations of Sartre to de-emphasize the political, or ethical, Sartre.

The Philosophy of Sartre begins with a "narrative prelude," ensconcing the reader in the superfluousness of existence by reference to Nausea and Roquentin's uneasiness. Hatzimoysis wonders about the similarity between Roquentin's attempt to master experience through artistic creation and Sartre's own literary adventures, finally insisting on the necessity of disassociating Roquentin, his desire for an aestheticized eternity, and Sartre. This section sets up the main foci of the book, the inescapable contingency of existence and the externality of consciousness.

In Chapter 2, "Intentionality," Hatzimoysis focuses on the relation between consciousness and object and the insistence on the priority of concrete existence and external objects. Hatzimoysis insists that it is Sartre's originality in "unpacking" the doctrine of intentionality that sets him apart from others and understands Sartre's claim, "consciousness is necessarily consciousness of something that is other than consciousness itself," as separating Sartre from rival views for which consciousness is bound to things internal to the mind. This qualification of intentionality is crucial for Hatzimoysis' further analysis, in which he claims that the emphasis on the object lends itself to an objectivist interpretation of the phenomena of perception, such as the notion of "aspect," and concomitantly explains Sartre's hostility to the solipsistic notion of an intentional content of consciousness separate from the intentional object. Notably, Hatzimoysis' analysis does not refer to the transformation in Sartre's own thinking vis-à-vis consciousness, from this intentional bursting forward to transcendence as the directedness of consciousness towards objects in light of its own projects, influenced by Heidegger.

After extracting Sartre's distinctive view of intentionality from what Hatzimoysis argues are problematically subjectivist and idealist alternatives, he explains how this view motivates Sartre's critique of the substantial ego (in Chapter 3, "The Ego"). Here, Hatzymosis is adept at outlining the landscape of various traditional interpretations and problems of Sartrean consciousness. In the first sections, he separates Sartre's elusive non-positional consciousness from the standard interpretation in terms of the focal/ periphery and the equally misleading "non-attentiveness" hypothesis. This analysis lays the groundwork for Hatzimoysis' central claim of the chapter, that the ego is an object for consciousness, not its source. In the rest of the chapter, Hatzimoysis unpacks Sartre's arguments that the ego is redundant in the explanation of the unity and individuality of consciousness, shattering traditional understandings of an ego or subject that "has" consciousness.

Chapters 4 and 5, "Emotion" and "Imagination," build directly from the problem of explaining the unity of consciousness and the constitution of psychical life, Sartre's phenomenological psychology. Sartre's externalized consciousness is crucial for distinguishing his theory of emotion from other theories; imagination is likewise clarified. In this sense, Hatzimoysis is successful in building the connection between his chosen themes. In content, these two chapters are the richest of the book. It is not surprising that the author is able to draw such a complex picture of emotion, both what it is and what it is not for Sartre, given the breadth of work he has already completed in this area (i.e., Philosophy and the Emotions, "Εmotions in Heidegger and Sartre," "Sentimental Value"). Hatzimoysis painstakingly lays out the competing theories of emotion in order to tease out the nuance of Sartre's own theory, and his methodology is faithful to Sartre's own dialectical process: concentrating on the arguments, considering possible interpretations, and eliminating alternative or oppositional explanations. He begins by staking out the difference between Sartre's understanding of psychic states and peripheric (somatic) as well as behaviorist accounts, in an effort to rescue Sartre from the common assumption that he equates emotions to actions. Hatzimoysis also develops the argument against unconscious emotions, the existence of which would be devastating to Sartre's understanding of consciousness.

After this negative mode of presentation, Hatzimoysis presents Sartre's positive account: "the core of the Sartrean view is that during an emotional episode one's relation to the world is 'magically' transformed by means of one's body" (68). Interestingly, Hatzimoysis develops this perplexing idea in terms of the passage from the non-reflective consciousness 'instrumental world' to the 'emotional world' in a way that opens the possibility for interpreting emotions as more than merely ways of avoiding reality.  Just as in the analysis of intentionality, "in genuine emotion, . . . one's consciousness is not reflective, but out in the world, a case of living the significance of the situation with one's whole body" (76). Emotions are meaningful and add to our understanding of the world. Hatzimoysis uses the last section to establish a clear connection to the next theme in his book, concluding that, if this activity of consciousness (magical transformation of emotion) does indeed change the way that reality is experienced by the subject, it raises questions about the status of these qualities and different modes of apprehension of the world, leading to an investigation of Sartre's theory of imagination as the primary place where there arise questions of intending things differently from the way they exist in reality.

The leading question of chapter 5 on imagination is how consciousness can intend an object that is not there, which Hatzimoysis, following Sartre, quickly transforms into the more interesting one of what is consciousness given this ability. The most illuminative part of the chapter is Hatzimoysis' description of the analogon, Sartre's solution to explaining the absent intended object through knowledge, affectivity, and kinaesthetic sensation. Reiterating Sartre's anti-idealism, Hatzimoysis emphasizes how the image is not a psychic miniature or mental replica of an object but a different mode of intending a real object; it is also distinct from other forms of conscious activity such as perception, which requires a present object. As Hatzimoysis is quick to explain, these activities are different modes of intending the same object, immediately present (perceiving) or intended as absent (imagining). Hatzimoysis, following Sartre, asserts that the irreal, as negation of the worldly status of the object, is essential to imagining: "being able to intend things as being otherwise than they are is a necessary condition for acting so as to effect changes that would make the real world fit one's 'irreal view' of it" (103). Teasing out the implications of this statement would have been a fruitful way to further cement the imagination as central to Sartre's entire project, as it is directly related to the possibility of freedom and the political to think otherwise.

Lastly, Hatzimoysis moves to Sartre's ontology, returning consciousness to the irreducibility of being. This section considers both the "being of appearing" and the "being of the object" elicited from Sartrean monism in order to consider Sartre's own preoccupation with whether we can have a direct apprehension of reality. Hatzimoysis explains that, for Sartre, the being (of the object) is transphenomenal: existence is the presupposition for the object to have any dimensions in the first place.  Thus we are returned to Nausea and the superfluous. This is a problem in that it belies the project of having access to reality in a way that Sartre thought he had overcome in overcoming the dualism of traditional philosophy. Hatzimoysis problematizes this on two levels. First, he questions the Sartrean essence, the fact that the appearance can be a "full positivity" and, second, he challenges the language of "modes of being" as implying existence as a sort of predicative of an object. Hatzimoysis leaves the reader with several critical problems to consider, such as, if being is the condition of every revelation, is the phenomenological gesture toward the immediacy of the experience of being thwarted?

The guiding thread in Hatzimoysis' account is the emphasis on Sartre's commitment to the phenomenological process, and through his own analysis, as well as the opening up of Sartre's own method, he provides a clear view of how central this is to Sartre's philosophy. Hatzimoysis is at his best when clearly analyzing alternative interpretive claimants, an eliminative process that both showcases his knowledge of the various debates in which Sartre was engaged and presents the opportunity for greater precision of Sartre's main concepts. I found it sometimes hard to discern where Sartre's nuances end and the insertion of modern concerns of philosophy of mind begin. That being said, there are definitely fruitful lines of engagement in this book, especially for those looking for a fresh perspective on issues of consciousness and elements of psychic activity. The book accomplishes the task of expositing several key Sartrean themes, offering the reader the possibility of thinking with the author about problems that have significance in current philosophical frameworks, thus reviving Sartre for a new audience.

Thus, Anthony Hatzimoysis' The Philosophy of Sartre does serve as a good introduction to some aspects of Sartre's thought, yet, as a reader familiar with Sartre, I found the absence of key ideas such as responsibility, the relation to others, and freedom or transcendence conspicuous. Granted, the decision towards circumspection is admitted in the preface, but, in a book that seeks to explain the life of consciousness, the absence of things such as the significance of the other for self-awareness is striking. Likewise striking is the effort not to deal with Sartre on certain levels: "Popular misconceptions to the contrary, there are no political, moral, humanistic, theistic or secular overtones in Sartre's primary use of the notion of freedom" (103). This statement is revealing in its singularity and abrupt placement, from another discussion perhaps, and it remains undeveloped, a refusal that seems to underlie certain choices in the book. In effect, this book is primarily an analysis of the various elements of consciousness proposed by Sartre, an introduction to Sartre's phenomenological psychology, not a book that seeks to understand Sartre's philosophic prerogative, which was undoubtedly political.