The Philosophy of Trust

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Paul Faulkner and Thomas Simpson (eds.), The Philosophy of Trust, Oxford University Press, 2016, 336pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198732549.

Reviewed by Sanford C. Goldberg, Northwestern University


Paul Faulkner and Thomas Simpson are to be congratulated on an excellent volume on the timely (and increasingly discussed) topic of trust. The book covers the gamut, from the social and political aspects of trust, to the ethics of trust, to the epistemology of trust. It brings together some of the leading figures on the topic, as well as some who are not as well known. I would recommend it highly for anyone with even a passing interest in the nature of trust.

In their helpful introduction, Faulkner and Simpson identify three main themes that emerge in the volume: trust and cooperation, trust and knowledge, and trust and social philosophy. But this level of abstraction does not suggest the full richness of the book, nor does it hint at the range of topics covered. Among these I would include the nature and varieties of trust, methodological issues in the study of trust, the (practical and/or epistemic) rationality of trust, the normative expectations associated with trust, the relations between trust and trustworthiness, trust and belief, the psychology of trust, the evolution of trust, the various speech acts that seem to "invite" trust (especially promising, telling, and asserting), and trust within and of groups. It is a volume that should appeal as much to political and social philosophers as to epistemologists and ethicists.

Several papers stand out as particularly interesting (and/or provocative), and I will restrict the substance of my comments to these papers. In doing so I hope to convey something of the range of topics that are addressed in this volume.

In "But I Was Counting on You!", Karen Jones aims to characterize the nature of trust and trustworthiness by understanding the nature of the complaint expressed in the title. Her key idea is that "reasonable . . . countings on give rise to legitimate normative expectations" (90), and she uses this idea to capture the nature and content of the norms in play in such cases. The view she develops is interesting in that she provides a novel motivation for, and a new gloss of, a traditional conception of trust. The traditional conception holds that trust involves a kind of nested reliance on others. According to this conception, one trusts another person, T, when one relies on T to do something while also relying on T to take this reliance as a reason to be responsive to that very first-order reliance. But if this conception is traditional, Jones's gloss of trust is decidedly not traditional. Whereas most who hold that trust involves this sort of nested reliance construe the phenomenon of trust in highly moralized terms -- in terms of our being entitled to certain reactive attitudes when the trust is violated -- Jones holds that "the norms of trust and trustworthiness are not themselves moral" (90). Instead, she regards these norms as deriving from our "interest" as finite social creatures in "enhanc[ing] the effectiveness of our agency" through cooperative (trusting) efforts (101). She continues,

As finite and social agents we have a pressing interest in being able to do this. However, this interest that we have in being able to extend our agency in this way is not a distinctly moral interest. It is about making agency effective by drawing on the agency of others rather than about making it good. Extended agential power is an ends-independent value. Whatever our ends, we want to be able to recruit the agency of others: even counter-ethical projects require recruits. (101-02; italics in original)

On such a picture, the "heart of trust" is in the "dual structure of dependency -- counting on the other, in a domain, and counting on them to respond to the fact that we are counting on them. . . " (101) But this phenomenon is present whenever we are pursuing ends with others. I find this approach intriguing; since I imagine that it will be controversial among ethicists (!), it is worthy of further development and defense. One question is whether we might allow Jones' core contention, that the norms of trust derive from our interest in extending our agency (and that this interest holds even in cases in which the ends we pursue are immoral), with the idea that, even so, there is a moral dimension to trust and trustworthiness. One possibility is to regard the norms of trust and trustworthiness as reflecting our fundamental interest in extending our agency, while also holding that this is itself a fundamentally moral interest -- in the same way that an interest in ensuring that others are in a position to exercise their individual agency is a moral interest, even when the result is that they sometimes act in ways that are morally bad. However, I am far from certain that this will prove to be a plausible (and stable) position; whether or not it is, I think Jones has captured something deep and important in her reflections on the rationale of the norms of trust.

A second paper that embraces something like this traditional view of trust as nested reliance, and yet which expands on it in interesting and novel ways, is by Victoria McGeer and Philip Pettit. In "The Empowering Theory of Trust," they develop an account of the mechanisms in play in cases of what has previously been called "therapeutic trust" -- cases in which one's manifest reliance on another is meant to provide a reason for the relied-upon party to do as (s)he is being relied upon to do. (This was a topic of Pettit's 1995 paper "The Cunning of Trust," as well as of McGeer's 2008 paper "Trust, Hope, and Empowerment.") Here, McGeer and Pettit identify two ways in which by manifesting one's trust in another, one can provide a "situational enhancement" (22) of their dependability. The first is through "encouraging" the other to prove dependable; and the second is to make the other more resilient in the face of obstacles. What is of interest here is McGeer's and Pettit's conception of trust-responsiveness as a "work in progress" (31), something that can benefit from regular reinforcement even among those with a track record of trustworthiness. While this is not their main interest, the empirical predictions that their theory makes, concerning additional sources of support for encouraging and enhancing trustworthiness, are worthy of further attention.

Stephen Darwall's "Trust as a Second-Personal Attitude (of the Heart)" is also in keeping with the traditional nested reliance view of trust. Darwall employs such a view to argue that trust is a second-personal attitude -- roughly, an attitude in which one addresses another as "you," thereby implicating a personal relationship involving mutuality and reciprocity. What makes trust distinctive, according to Darwall, is that whereas most second-personal attitudes are paradigmatically deontic, in that they presuppose authority and accountability relations, trust does not involve one's having any authority over the one who is trusted. Instead, trust, as a second-personal attitude, is more like love in being an "attitude of the heart" (46). Such a view is intriguing, though it will likely be controversial among those proponents of the nested reliance view of trust who also hope to employ such a view in their account of epistemic trust (the sort of trust in play in testimony cases). For if the expectations of trust are not deontic -- if they do not invoke relations of authority and accountability -- it is hard to see how trusting another's say-so, by itself, can underwrite a distinctive kind of (testimony-based) knowledge. While this negative result will be welcomed by the many critics of trust-based approaches to the epistemology of testimony, it will likely antagonize those who endorse such an approach. In any case, the viability of Darwall's understanding of trust for epistemic purposes is worth further reflection. (I do not here assume that Darwall himself endorses any such approach to the epistemology of testimony; on the contrary, he appears to have resisted such an approach in his 2006 book The Second-Person Standpoint.)

Not everyone in the book favors the nested reliance conception of trust, and several of the papers call for or develop interesting alternatives. Here I highlight two: Philip Nickel's "Being Pragmatic about Trust" and Bernd Lahno's "Trust and Collective Agency."

Nickel argues that while many views of trust, including variants on the nested reliance account, develop out of philosophical questions concerning the nature of trust, we ought rather to be "pragmatic" in our choice of an account of trust, and see which account best explains the relevant range of social phenomena (195). Focusing in the first instance on the Trust Game, Nickel argues for what he calls the "Explanatory Constraint":

trust should (a) be explained as the outcome of central concerns or interests of the relevant actors, and (b) explain the emergence and sustenance of cooperative practices and social institutions. . . (197)

According to Nickel, conceptions of trust that have emerged in such fields as sociology, political science, and economics, fare much better in this regard than do those accounts that have been developed in philosophy. Here Nickel has in mind accounts deriving from Annette Baier's familiar view, where trust is seen as involving a reliance on another's good will; but Nickel also targets the sort of dependence-responsiveness accounts of trust found in Pettit and McGeer's paper, as well as in Paul Faulkner's recent work. While Nickel argues that such views do not fare particularly well in connection with the Explanatory Constraint, his ultimate conclusion is a "pragmatic" one: "philosophers should [regard] the argument from explanatory potential . . . as a way of grading accounts of trust." (211) I wonder, however, whether it really is best to see the various accounts of trust as competing with one another, as opposed to highlighting slightly different phenomena that are associated with one another in a "family resemblance" sort of way. After all, when one reads the various accounts of trust in the philosophy literature, one cannot but be struck by the familiarity of the various types of cases they highlight, and by the ability of the accounts to explain many of the disparate (ethical and epistemological) features of those cases. The idea here -- that there might be no single thing we designate when we speak of "trust," but rather a variety of distinct phenomena that are grouped under a single label owing to their family resemblances -- has already been pursued, e.g., by Thomas Simpson in his 2012 paper, "What is Trust?" While Nickel does cite this paper, I found myself wishing that he had more seriously engaged with that paper's contention.

Lahno addresses the viability of traditional game-theoretic approaches to trust. He uses several types of coordination problem to illustrate a challenge facing traditional game-theoretic reasoning: one's preferences in such case are merely conditional on the choices of others. (Here it is worth noting in passing that this is a point that at the heart of Cristina Bicchieri's excellent work on social norms). The challenge is that one cannot explain coordination in terms of these conditional preferences. Lahno argues that this problem is solved if we allow teams to be agents, since teams will have unconditional preferences. He then goes on to propose that trust itself is required to make sense of reasoning from the perspective of the team.

Interestingly, one of the central presuppositions of Lahno's paper, that groups can be trustworthy, is called into question by Katherine Hawley in her "Trustworthy Groups and Organizations." If we start off by assuming one or another standard (philosophical) view of trust and trustworthiness, Hawley argues, we see that none of them are readily applied to groups or organizations. Here she draws on her own influential work on trust and distrust, and her focus is primarily on what we might call epistemic trust -- trust in a speaker for the truth on an occasion of testimony. In this context, Hawley argues, the standard rationale for drawing the distinction between mere reliance and trust evaporates. She proposes that we talk instead of our (mere) reliance on groups or organizations. However, insofar as Hawley structures her discussion in terms of the standard views of trust, we might wonder whether the conclusion to draw is not the one Hawley draws (i.e., that groups are not proper objects of trust), but rather that this result is so much the worse for standard views of trust. In this connection one sees the fruitfulness of the sort of methodological question raised in Nickel's paper: precisely what should we be trying to account for in an account of trust? But whatever one decides on this matter, Hawley's reflections are a useful reminder of the difficulty of applying standard views of trust to the case of groups and institutions.

This review cannot do justice to the range of topics covered in this volume, or to the quality of the papers. In addition to the papers noted above, the volume also contains contributions from a number of authors whose views on trust are well-known, including Ted Hinchman (offering a further development of the assurance theory of trust), Paul Faulkner (offering further reflections on the "problem" of trust), Jacopo Domenicucci and Richard Holton (defending the view that trust should be seen as a two-place relation -- trusting someone -- rather than as a three-place relation -- trusting someone to do something), Ben McMyler (critically assessing Richard Holton's claim that we can decide to trust), Thomas Simpson (defending the idea, which some have questioned, that trust can be based on the evidence of another's trustworthiness), and David Owens (addressing the different kinds of trust elicited by promises and other speech acts). In addition, there are other contributors whose work on trust will not be quite as familiar: Collin O'Neil (who develops an account of betrayed trust), Guy Longworth (well-known for his work in philosophy of language, but here developing themes on faith and trust in Kant), and Robert Stern (whose work on transcendental arguments is well-known, but here developing the view of trust of the Danish philosopher and theologian Knud Ejler L√łgstrup).

I must conclude, however, by registering one generic concern about the book. In the past two decades or so, the topic of trust has been addressed by a particularly diverse group of philosophers, men and women, at various career stages. No doubt some decisions needed to be made to focus the volume. By and large I do not question the decisions the editors appear to have made. But I was concerned to see that -- as will have been noted -- of seventeen contributing authors only three were women, and of the thirteen articles written by a stand-alone author only two were written by women. This is disappointing, especially given the extent of the excellent work done by women on the topic of trust. (Various names come to mind rather quickly; in no particular order, they include Onora O'Neill, Pamela Hieronymi, Cristina Bicchieri, Karen Frost-Arnold, Lorraine Code, Nancy Potter, Naomi Scheman, Heidi Grasswick, Judith Simon, Kristina Rolin, Elizabeth Fricker, and Linda Zagzebski -- and no doubt there are many others.) I do not mean to call into question the sincerity of the editors' efforts in this regard: on the contrary, I have no reason to doubt that sincerity, and I have good reason to trust that they were sincere in their efforts. Still, it is worth highlighting that we as a philosophy community need to do better securing a greater diversity in the contributors to edited volumes and elsewhere -- especially when the topic is one that has already attracted such a diverse set of writers.