The Philosophy Scare: The Politics of Reason in the Early Cold War

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John McCumber, The Philosophy Scare: The Politics of Reason in the Early Cold War, University of Chicago Press, 2016, 218pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226396385.

Reviewed by George A. Reisch


In his influential book, The Rise of Scientific Philosophy of 1951, Hans Reichenbach applauded the arrival of logical positivism for philosophical reasons. In his new book, John McCumber offers a very different account of how and why Reichenbach's style of philosophy displaced its main rivals, pragmatism and continental philosophy. By examining archival files, departmental correspondence, and the records of the California State Senate Fact-Finding Subcommittee on Un-American Activities (CUAC), McCumber contends that the rise of scientific philosophy took place not in some ideal world of competing doctrines, but within two institutions born during the cold war: UCLA, which became autonomous in 1952, and the RAND corporation.

How did Reichenbach's brand of logical positivism win the day? By better navigating the pressures and rewards ("sticks" and "carrots") that McCumber treats in different chapters. It better skirted controversies about atheism, for example, that surrounded the appointment of Max Otto to UCLA's department in 1947. And it forged a conceptual and personal alliance with rational choice theory articulated by Kenneth Arrow at the RAND corporation. (Reichenbach and his student Olaf Helmer worked at RAND, and Arrow was Helmer's intern, McCumber notes). This alliance formed what McCumber calls "Cold War philosophy." It embraced a theory of mind and its capabilities, an image of the sciences (or nature itself, on a metaphysical reading) stratified by reducible levels, and a commitment to a unitary theory of knowledge that readily exported to economics and social science. At this point McCumber's book is complemented (and arguably supported) by the recently published How Reason Almost Lost Its Mind (Paul Erickson, et al., Chicago 2015), which identifies a "cold war rationality" that also originated in rational choice theory. Where Erickson, et al. are interested in how cold war thinking circulated in the social and behavioral sciences, however, McCumber argues that Cold War philosophy aligned the academy (represented by UCLA and the larger California system) with the geopolitics of the cold war. Its assumption of calculational rationality exercised by free, nondogmatic individuals stood as an antidote to Soviet collectivism and as a natural justification for capitalism. "When Cold War philosophy became the operating philosophy of the United States," McCumber writes, "this was elevated into a new social gospel" (112) -- until the 1960s, that is, when pragmatism, phenomenology, and existentialism begin to find their way back into university departments (though not necessarily philosophy departments).

McCumber knows his story will meet incredulity, if not hostility, in some professional quarters. Even if his account of UCLA bears little resemblance to the cold war experiences of other departments (he invites readers at other institutions to extend his study), the stature of the California system alone will make it difficult for skeptics to maintain that philosophy stood apart from the drama, anxieties, and high stakes of the cold war. McCumber puts that ideal to rest in his analysis of the organizational machinery known as the "California Plan" and its philosophical rationalization known as "the Allen formula," named after Raymond Allen, the president of the University of Washington and subsequently UCLA's first chancellor. The plan created a hierarchy of officers and informers who functioned secretly to weed out potential subversives and to make sure none was hired into university departments. Yes, UCLA in these pages begins to look like East Germany in the 50s, and there are even roles for brainwashing and mind control. McCumber does not use those words, but he claims nonetheless that the California Plan did not just help to transform philosophy. It transformed philosophers and "turned them, willing or not, into certain kinds of knowers" (118).

This book is well written and thorough. It admirably joins empirical historical research to systematic philosophical analysis (such as McCumber's detailed comparison of Reichenbach's philosophy of science and Arrow's rational choice theory). There are a few small mistakes having to do with Rudolf (not Rudolph) Carnap and his principle of tolerance (which applies to creating philosophical languages, not the empirical content of protocol reports [see 105]); and I could not find a full reference to the report "CUAC 1951" from which McCumber pulls important quotations. For those less interested in the details, larger questions are likely to stand out. Is it true, for example, that Reichenbach's views so dominated philosophy departments, much less scientific philosophy, in the 50s? Was it really so easy for logical positivists to escape the stigma of atheism while upholding reductionism and the unity of science? And were pragmatism and logical empiricism incompatible rivals in this landscape, when figures like Ernest Nagel, Charles Morris, and Philipp Frank -- admittedly working outside the orbit of RAND and UCLA -- worked to combine them in various ways?

This book clearly advances our understanding of this era by maintaining a close focus on these two institutions, particularly UCLA's philosophy department, and raising these and surely other more general historical questions. One problem arising from this close focus, I suggest, is McCumber's slight treatment of Sidney Hook, a New Yorker who stood behind the crucial "Allen Formula." It held that

Communists should be denied academic employment, not because they hold undesirable opinions, but because their allegiance to Moscow had led them to abandon the scientific method -- a method that Allen, though there is no evidence that he ever read Reichenbach, understood in unitary terms very similar to his. (136)

McCumber's view of Reichenbach as a primary source of Cold War philosophy has led him to overlook Hook. Whether or not Allen ever read Reichenbach, we know that he met and corresponded with Hook at a time when Hook dedicated himself to the growing controversy over Communist faculty. He engaged university administrators like Allen at the University of Washington and Conant at Harvard to inform them about the Communist conspiracy and the immanent dangers universities faced from hidden Communists in their institutions. Hook simultaneously engaged the public (in venues like The New York Times and The Saturday Evening Post) to explain that educators understood the gravity of the problem and to reassure Americans that academia could handle this problem itself.[1] Because Communists could not think clearly and independently, and because their devotion to Communism led them to indoctrinate, rather than teach, Hook called for suspicious intellectuals to be evaluated by their peers and neither hired nor allowed to continue teaching if they had been politically compromised. The Allen Formula, that is, is better understood as Hook's formula; and the California Plan was not too different from the kind of remedy that Hook proposed for the problem of Communist faculty around the nation.

McCumber notes that Hook and Allen had a "collaboration" (193, n. 4) but does not explore how that collaboration fits into his story. McCumber points out, for example, that before Allen was a cold warrior he was a thoughtful liberal who seemed hostile neither to pragmatism or socialism ("he had even said some good things about the Soviet Union" [141]). What happened? Sidney Hook, most likely. Ellen Schrecker closely studied these controversies and the relevant correspondence to conclude that Hook persuaded Allen to take a hard line against Communist faculty and coached him on how to rationalize it not as a matter of suppressing political opinion but as a matter of professional standards. Hook denied having this role when Schrecker later asked him, but his correspondence during these years supports Schrecker's intuition. When Hook tutored fellow intellectuals and educators about the evils of Communism, he typically did not stop tutoring until they understood the problems of Communism in his terms.[2]

I digress from McCumber's book not to say that Hook, instead of Reichenbach, is the rightful villain here. There were many villains within the story of academic anticommunism. Hook's relationship to Allen reminds us that the larger national context matters and it supports a final and admittedly tentative methodological criticism of The Philosophy Scare. In one sense, this book is at odds with itself. It begins with a theoretical discussion of Kuhn and Foucault that is designed to help illuminate the rise and eventual undoing of Cold War philosophy. Yet, McCumber's research seems to confirm that in the California system these politics were driven by fear, and sometimes panic, on the part of educators, administrators, and the public. It seemed to spread among intellectuals (from Hook to Allen, for example) and it motivated otherwise thoughtful and principled faculty and administrators to trample their colleagues (or stand aside while others did) in the ways that McCumber describes -- often as if their careers and lives depended on it. So it is that many accounts of this era in American history have titles like David Caute's The Great Fear, Scott Martelle's The Fear Within, and David Johnson's The Lavender Scare.

In its title, McCumber's book follows suit. But after finishing the book and rereading those first several pages about Kuhn and Foucault, it struck me that McCumber may have missed his book's strongest point. If some of the best and brightest at UCLA were so shaped, if not controlled, by the emotional intensity of these controversies, why assume that Kuhn and Foucault, both of whom came of age during the cold war, offer independent, objective theoretical probes of these tumultuous events and anxious times? The theory of paradigms that McCumber discusses at some length was finalized by Kuhn in the early 60s when he was teaching at Berkeley, after all.

My guess is that McCumber is not fundamentally committed to Kuhn and Foucault, but he is committed to some kind of Hegelian Reason. In his view, I imagine, it twists and turns within the texts and events he examines; but by unraveling it and placing it within this preliminary theoretical framework he hopes that philosophy and Reason -- like de Gaulle returning to Paris -- can be seen to finally prevail over politics and fear. This is a philosopher's history of philosophy, in other words, and an optimistic one, at that.

[1] See, for example, Sidney Hook, "What Shall We Do about Communist Teachers?" Saturday Evening Post, 10 September 1949: 164-68. On the Communist conspiracy, see Hook's essay, "International Communism," Dartmouth Alumni Magazine (March 1949): 13-20, a copy of which Hook sent to Conant. See Hook to Conant, April 11, 1949, Sidney Hook Papers, Stanford University, box 10, folder 6.

[2] Schrecker's correspondence with Hook is in Shapiro, ed. Letters of Sidney Hook (M.E. Sharpe, 1995), 322. Other treatments of Hook's relationship with Allen include Sigmund Diamond, Compromised Campus (Oxford, 1992), 320; Hugh Wilford, The Mighty Wurlitzer (Harvard, 2008), 77. A vivid testament to Hook's persistence is his exchange with Victor Lowe in 1951 and 1952 (Journal of Philosophy 48[14] and 49[4]). See also John Rossi, "Farewell to Fellow Traveling: The Waldorf Peace Conference of March 1949," Continuity 10, 1985, 1-31.