The Pittsburgh School of Philosophy: Sellars, McDowell, Brandom

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Chauncey Maher, The Pittsburgh School of Philosophy: Sellars, McDowell, Brandom, Routledge, 2012, 156pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415804424.

Reviewed by Jeremy Wanderer and Steven Levine, University of Massachusetts, Boston


Maher's book has two goals, one explicit and one implicit. The explicit goal is to provide the novice with an accessible entry-point to the writings of Wilfrid Sellars, John McDowell and Robert Brandom, by comparing and contrasting their respective understandings of what is involved in 'human rational engagement with the world' (121). The implicit goal is to make it plausible that these three thinkers constitute a philosophical school -- 'in some interesting sense of the word' (2).

In pursuit of the explicit goal, Maher concentrates on a cluster of topics relating to the trio's shared rejection of 'the Given', construed here as a cognitive state whose epistemic standing is not dependent on any other state, yet is transmissible to other cognitive states somehow dependent on it. The first chapter sketches some of the reasons for the philosophical appeal of the Given in its perceptual guise, as well some of the reasons why this trio of thinkers treat it as a myth. The next three chapters provide background relevant for understanding this rejection of the Given, including discussion of their respective positions on the topics of belief and concepts (chapter 2), rule-following (chapter 3) and meaning (chapter 4). Building on this extended critique, the fifth chapter surveys positive attempts by each member of this trio to avoid skepticism without succumbing to the allure of the Given. The final chapter extends the discussion to include intentional action, thereby revealing the interrelatedness of theoretical and practical reason in making sense of the role of concepts in rational activity. Each chapter proceeds by first introducing the particular topic under discussion, then outlining a broad approach to the topic purportedly shared by each of the trio, and concluding with a discussion of differences between the thinkers set against this shared background.

There has been much recent interest in the work of each of these three philosophers, yet their respective writings are extensive and notoriously difficult to follow. As a result, there has been a variety of introductory volumes aiming to help the uninitiated reader grasp just how things 'hang together' with regards to a specific member of the trio.[1] Perhaps due to the selectivity necessitated by approaching all three at once, Maher's book stands out amongst this group as offering the most accessible first port of call for the struggling student approaching the work of either Sellars, McDowell or Brandom. It is clearly and unpretentiously written; includes frequent previews and summaries throughout the narrative; and helpfully invites the reader into further engagement with the relevant thinkers by noting particular points of contention, puzzlement or incompleteness. The book thus succeeds in reaching its explicit goal, which is a genuine achievement given the difficult nature of the material involved.

For the reader already familiar with the writings of this trio, it is the implicit aim of the book -- the suggestion that this trio of thinkers form a philosophical school in some interesting sense -- that is of potential interest. Unfortunately, this suggestion is insufficiently explored to satisfy the initiated reader. Talk of 'the Pittsburgh School of philosophy' may make one think it operates something like 'the Frankfurt School', but the former lacks the formal organization and explicit formulation of aims and projects characteristic of the latter. What, then, is added by calling this trio a 'philosophical school'? Maher's answer is that 'the main point in calling them a "school" . . . and not just a "mere group" . . . is that they share concerns and views' (2). It is precisely this answer implicit in the book as a whole, where the differences between the trio are repeatedly set against the vast amount of common agreement between them on 'certain big ideas concerning experience, concepts norms and meanings' (120). But this stress on common content is insufficient as a response to the question. After all, many philosophers -- both in and out of Pitt -- are engaged with understanding the nature of experience, concepts, norms and meaning in light of concerns with some form of the Given, even though they would not typically be identified with anything called 'The Pittsburgh School of Philosophy'. Even adding the requirement of self-identification will not help; McDowell, for example, infamously resists 'being cast as the hind legs of a pantomime horse called "Pittsburgh neo-Hegelianism"'.[2] More thus needs to be said about the interesting sense of applying the label of 'philosophical school' than emerges from the discussion in the book.

It is not just that focus on shared concerns and content is insufficient to characterize the trio as members of a philosophical school, it is also misleading. This is because the repeated focus on commonality in the text leads to an insufficient discussion of the substantive differences between these thinkers.

Consider the issue of naturalism. As Maher rightly points out, all three philosophers resist the Myth of the Given by arguing, in different ways, that mind and meaning are normative phenomena. In Sellarsian shorthand, mental states have content and epistemic status only by having standing in the space of reasons. Maher's focus is on showing how the trio take up this insight by fleshing out a normative functionalist account of mind and meaning and a non-foundationalist theory of knowledge. But what gets almost no attention is the fact that each thinker also has a distinctive view about how normativity fits into the natural world. This is not some side issue that can be ignored. For Sellars, for example, the question of how the 'manifest' and 'scientific image' are related is theparamount issue that a philosopher must confront. For him, the critique of the Myth of the Given -- and the consequent articulation of a normative functionalist account of mind and meaning and non-foundationalist account of knowledge -- is part of a larger explanatory strategy to show that thought and its content can be included in a thoroughly naturalistic account of the mind. One must take this normative turn to be a naturalist turn, Sellars thinks, because to not do so requires accepting the Given, which in turn entails accepting abstract entities that are recalcitrant to naturalistic treatment. Maher's account does not convey a sense that Sellars is not only interested in articulating positive theories of mind, meaning, knowledge, intention, etc., but also in showing how these theories allow him to 'save the appearances' of their existence in the manifest image, while also showing how these phenomena ultimately admit of a thoroughly naturalistic treatment.

Both Brandom and McDowell disavow this dual aim. While Brandom accepts that normativity goes all the way down, McDowell thinks that Sellars' revisionary philosophical practice should be rejected altogether. Let us focus on McDowell, as his view here contrasts most strongly with Sellars'. While in chapter 5 Maher gives a clear account of how McDowell's view of perceptual intentionality avoids the oscillation between the Myth of the Given and Coherentism, he never brings into focus the fact that what is ultimately important for McDowell is to disarm the theoretical pressures, brought about by naturalistic anxieties, which force us into thinking that these two positions exhaust theoretical space. Because our intellectual culture routinely accepts a distinction between the realm of law and the space of reasons, it becomes a mystery how normatively governed mental states can have empirical purport. McDowell's aim is not so much to answer this mystery but to exorcise the need to give an answer by providing us with 'philosophical reminders', in this case reminders that nature includes 'second nature'.

There are two important points here. The first is that McDowell's 'second-nature naturalism' amounts to a quite distinct picture of nature, one that diverges from Sellars' conception in deep and significant ways. The second point is that McDowell's goal in articulating this picture is not to give a stand-alone solution to the problem of how there can be norms in a natural world, or how normatively governed mental states can have empirical world-directed content, but to show us that there is no problem to be solved in the first place. In chapter 4, Maher portrays this feature of McDowell's writings, his so-called philosophical quietism, mainly as a strategy for resisting the need to give positive explanations (which Brandom, in contrast, thinks there is a need for). But quietism is not just about resisting the need to give explanations. It is part of a larger therapeutic philosophical practice that aims to help us get beyond feeling compelled to give 'side-ways on' explanations, explanations that are motivated by the naturalistic anxieties mentioned above. So while Maher mentions that McDowell's philosophical practice is different from Sellars' (andBrandom's), he does not explore the depth of the difference.

In complaining about the insufficient and misleading nature of Maher's own implicit response to the question: 'In what interesting sense do these philosophers constitute a philosophical school?',we do not mean to return a wholly negative response. That is, we do think that there is a genuinely interesting sense in which one can apply the title 'Pittsburgh School of Philosophy' to this trio, which goes beyond any appeal to shared content. The beginnings of an alternative would situate all three in the context of a particular interpretive tradition, with each engaged in conversation with the texts of certain predecessors who are treated as authoritative and with each other, and beholden to the assessment of future generations who too take part in this interpretive tradition. Developing this idea would itself involve an exploration of the following key characteristic of the writings of Sellars, McDowell and Brandom: each -- in his own way -- not only reveals his debt to the history of the discipline in his own philosophical investigations, but also self-consciously reflects on the role played by a tradition in the development of the very ability to think philosophically. This would require going into less explored aspects of their thought, including Brandom's reflections on reason and tradition in Tales of the Mighty Dead and McDowell'sGadamerian idea that language is the repository of tradition. It would also require a discussion of the Kantian and Hegelian themes that play out in their thought, and a more thorough discussion of the reception of Sellars by Brandom and McDowell, one that makes mention of certain key intermediaries like Rorty. It is revealing that these characteristics go entirely missing in Maher's generally ahistorical narrative.

We have contended that the book is far more successful in achieving its explicit goal than its implicit one. Given this, the book is primarily valuable an introductory primer, and a useful one at that. We thus cannot understand why the publishers have decided to market the book as a research monograph, slapping a hefty price tag ($125 for the thin volume) which places it out of the reach of much its intended audience ('undergraduates who have had several philosophy courses'). This is a genuine shame. We would have liked to recommend this book to some of our own students with an interest in this area, but are precluded from doing so by  its cost. (Another NDPR review recently raised the same concern. We hope that the publisher takes note).[3]


de Gaynesford, M. (2004). John McDowell. New York: Polity.

deVries, W. (2005). Wilfrid Sellars. Montreal: McGill-Queen's University Press.

McDowell, J. (2002) "Knowledge and the Internal Revisited", Philosophy and Phenomenological Research lxiv: 97-105.

O'Shea, J. (2007). Wilfrid Sellars. New York: Polity.

Thornton, T. (2004). John McDowell. Montreal: McGill-Queen's University Press.

Wanderer, J. (2008). Robert Brandom. Montreal: McGill-Queen's University Press.

[1] These include: de Gaynesford (2004), deVries (2005), O'Shea (2007) Thornton (2004), Wanderer (2008).

[2] McDowell (2002:98).

[3] Thanks to Willem DeVries and Chauncey Maher for comments on an earlier draft.