The Place of Prejudice: A Case for Reasoning within the World

Placeholder book cover

Adam Adatto Sandel, The Place of Prejudice: A Case for Reasoning within the World, Harvard University Press, 2014, 268pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780674726840.

Reviewed by Georgia Warnke, University of California, Riverside


On the back cover, Charles Taylor writes that this book "presents 'the prejudice against prejudice' and then the case against it in a clear and eloquent manner." I think this description is accurate. "The prejudice against prejudice" is Hans-Georg Gadamer's phrase, and The Place of Prejudice retraces part of the path of the second section of his Truth and Method. Adam Adatto Sandel presents the arguments Heidegger and Gadamer mount in favor of the role of prejudice and elaborates on their development of a situated conception of reason. Like Gadamer, Sandel also argues for the relevance of Aristotle in advancing this conception, and he concludes by defending the role of rhetoric in political life. For the most part, Sandel opts not to engage with the many critical studies of the works he reviews. (The exception is the first part of Chapter 2, in which he takes issue with interpretations Hubert Dreyfus, Piotr Hoffman and Richard Polt offer of Heidegger's account of Being-in-the-World). Nor does he refer to the ways Michael Walzer, Richard Rorty and others such as Taylor himself have already made "a case for reasoning within the world," and, more particularly, a case for political reasoning within the world. Rather, his point is to provide a clear restatement of the way in which reason is informed and enabled by our life circumstance, a restatement that, as Taylor suggests in his blurb, can make this argument to "English-speaking audiences in a way that can be widely understood."

In the first chapter, Sandel looks at criticisms of the force of prejudice starting with Francis Bacon and Descartes and extending through the work of Adam Smith and Kant. Bacon and Descartes are concerned with the way prejudices arising from habit and custom can muddy our understanding of nature, Smith and Kant with the way they can misguide our actions. For all four thinkers, Sandel says, the ideal is what he calls detached reason, the idea that "rational judgment must be untainted by prejudgments of any kind, including the understandings and commitments that we acquire from tradition, habit, custom and our upbringing" (p. 2). Bacon thus associates rationality with a blank slate, while Descartes wishes to avoid the entire process of upbringing and the prejudices it inculcates in us. Smith thinks we must examine our conduct as a fair and impartial spectator would, and Kant asks us to "make use of our own reason." On this way of thinking, Sandel notes, prejudices are antithetical to both knowledge and agency, to both truth and freedom. In the last part of the chapter, Sandel looks at Edmund Burke's "sentimental revival" of prejudice in a defense of tradition. For Burke, prejudice is either a "pleasing illusion" necessary to cover over our natural defects or an instrument of prudence. In neither case, however, does Burke offer us a conception of prejudice that Sandel thinks can contribute to "political deliberation and judgment" (p. 67).

Sandel notes that despite Kant's attack on prejudice, his Copernican turn sets the stage for the more "situated conception of understanding" (p. 51) that Sandel thinks can make a contribution. In Chapter 2, he takes up the way Heidegger works out this conception and the account of freedom and agency it makes possible. Perhaps because it engages with some other interpreters of Heidegger, this chapter is, to my mind, the most interesting in the book. Sandel objects to what he sees as Dreyfus's "contingent" reading of Being-in-the World as well as to both communitarian and existentialist readings. On Sandel's account, for Heidegger the threat to freedom comes not from the prejudices of a tradition but from becoming absorbed in the details of life in a way that obscures its whole (p. 113). For its part, freedom issues from an authentic life. To live authentically is to recognize one's commitments as parts of a narrative that always already possesses a unity of meaning that Heidegger conceives of as one's fate. For Sandel, Heidegger's conception of thrownness expresses this fate and has to be seen in conjunction with its corollary: projection, through which we take up and revise our being. The human being, or Dasein, is thrown projection and hence both "entirely passive and entirely active" (p. 125). Sandel uses Ronald Dworkin's image of a chain novel to get at the situated freedom at work here: while the writer who comes second or third in the sequence creates something new, he or she does not do so randomly, but only in light of the meaning of the whole, in terms of the unity of meaning the text expresses.

Despite using Truth and Method to structure his book, Sandel appears not to be as interested in Gadamer's ideas as he is in Heidegger's. Rather, Sandel limits his focus to the distinction Gadamer makes between enabling prejudices that illuminate texts and text-analogues for us and blind ones that mislead us. Sandel offers examples of each. Because the literary traditions we have inherited prejudice us in favor of poetry, they allow us to understand the deeper point of Socrates's criticism of poetry in the Republic, namely: that "poetry participates in bringing forth the very being, or truth, of its theme" (p. 177). As Sandel continues, "reading an ancient text with a certain "contemporary" prejudice may actually illuminate the text in a way that one might otherwise ignore -- especially if one attempts to suspend all prejudice" (pp. 177-78). As a misleading prejudice, Sandel points to the attempt to equate Plato's notion of opinion with subjective belief, following on the contemporary prejudice in favor of the subject-object distinction. While we can trust our prejudice in favor of poetry because it "fits with the twists and turns of the dialogue" (p. 178) in the Republic, we can recognize the way our prejudice in favor of the subject-object distinction misleads us, Sandel thinks, because it cannot make sense out of Plato's account, especially his view that opinion succeeds in grasping reality in some way. I think Sandel misses an opportunity here to buttress his point about the situated character of reason by omitting discussions of Gadamer's view of experience and his influential account of dialogue. Both show the way in which we can reflect on our prejudices, not, however, by retreating to detached reason but rather by putting those prejudices in play. I also think Sandel misses an opportunity to deepen his analysis by not trying to defend Gadamer's view against even its more prominent critics such as Jürgen Habermas and Paul Ricoeur.

Like Gadamer, however, Sandel does turn to Aristotle's conception of the good as a resource for an account of situated reason. Important here is Aristotle's respect for the opinions of his predecessors, which, he thinks can always contain "at least a glimmer of insight" (p. 200). Moreover, Sandel thinks we can understand Aristotle's account of a virtuous disposition of character in terms of prejudice -- "a viewpoint from which certain actions appear desirable" (p. 192). Indeed, the development of a virtuous character depends upon activities of judging well and performing virtuous deeds, in short, on habit:

For each act of moral deliberation and judgment develops our character, thereby improving our capacity for judgment. Habit is thus essential for attaining virtue, and by no coincidence, as Aristotle points out, the Greek word for ethical virtue, arete ethike derives from ethos, or habit. (p. 193)

In his final chapter, Sandel takes on the criticism of rhetoric as an illicit appeal to people's prejudices. Here he appeals to three rhetorically effective speeches that rebut this criticism in different ways. In campaigning for civil rights in the South, Lyndon Johnson uses examples evoking the daily rituals and concerns of Southerners, thereby appealing to their "prejudices" as situated in their own lives. According to Sandel, Lincoln's Gettysburg Address "only seems to rely on abstract statements alone" (p. 241). Instead, noting the detailed and grisly two-hour speech that preceded it, Sandal claims, "What gives the address its transcendent character is precisely the concrete circumstance that Lincoln could have invoked yet did not. In this sense the speech is firmly situated rather than detached" (p. 241). Finally, Frederick Douglass rejects abstract arguments in explaining the wrongness of slavery. Rather, he shows the way in which African-Americans' equality as human beings is already embodied both in the very laws that hold them responsible for disobedience and prevent them from being taught to read and write, as well as in the practices and activities they share with other Americans. It would be a mistake, Sandel thinks, to see Johnson, Lincoln and Douglass as pandering. Instead, their rhetoric is persuasive precisely because it invokes common ways of life and particular experiences.

Taylor thinks Sandel's book will "serve a great need in today's Anglophone philosophical world." Even those familiar with the points it makes will enjoy the sweep of its review across the history of philosophy and take pleasure in what Taylor is surely right to call its eloquence.