The Plain Truth: Descartes, Huet, and Skepticism

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Thomas M. Lennon, The Plain Truth: Descartes, Huet, and Skepticism, Brill , 2008, 255pp., $145.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789004171152.

Reviewed by Gianni Paganini, Università del Piemonte Orientale


Pierre-Daniel Huet (1630-1721), Bishop of Avranches, earned an important place in the history of modern scepticism thanks to Richard H. Popkin's classic History of Scepticism (which went into its third and last edition in 2003; on Huet see Ch. 17, pp. 254-73). He has now gained a deserved place in the history of Cartesian and post-Cartesian philosophy with this book by Thomas Lennon, which awards Huet a place that up to now, as a "minor" author, he had never enjoyed. Strictly speaking, we should say that the book concerns Descartes as much as Huet (as the subtitle says) and possibly the former more than the latter. Indeed, Lennon starts from Huet's criticism of Cartesian philosophy (first and foremost Censura philosophiae cartesianae [1689] of which he gave us an English translation with introduction and annotations [2003]). But he is continually concerned to demonstrate how little these objections grasped the true substance of Descartes' theory, and to show that the theory already contained effective replies to many of the objections. Not by chance are the last words of the book a true celebration of Descartes' "superiority": "The heroic, the defensible, the responsible Descartes" (p. 244).

It is known that Censura triggered a long-running polemic, with repeated revivals, between Huet and the Cartesian philosopher Pierre-Sylvain Regis. Regis published a Réponse au livre … Censura philosophiae cartesianae in 1691 and Huet took it into account for the new edition of Censura that appeared in 1694. Huet made a minute examination of Regis' book in a work (La censure de la réponse faite par M. Regis au livre intitulé Censura philosophiae cartesianae) that has never been published but is preserved in the Bibliothèque Nationale in Paris in a manuscript that is extremely difficult to read. Lennon carefully reconstructs the exchanges in the Huet-Regis polemic, as well as providing copious illustration of what we might call the side episodes, represented by the sceptical-academic production of Simon Foucher, and by the publication of Malebranche's much more innovative Recherche de la vérité. But above all he is concerned with getting directly to the source of Huet's objections, that is to Descartes' actual works and to the sets of Objections and Replies that followed Meditations, in which the replies to the problems that were to be raised by Huet are already frequently foreshadowed.

Were it not a complete historical anachronism, we could say that the true argument, or dominant theme, of Lennon's book is Descartes' "replies" to Huet. For evident chronological reasons Descartes could neither know nor still less reply to the doubts of his future critic, but many pages in this volume show that most of the objections made in Censura could have easily been resolved through a more careful reading, and above all one that stayed closer to the spirit of Descartes' epistemology and his metaphysics.

Lennon's starting point is the negative image that Huet paints of Descartes: a philosopher who, despite his initial doubts, emerges as a dangerous "dogmatic" ready to subjugate the truths of the faith to the reasons of philosophy; an arrogant thinker, guilty of "excessive self-regard and false confidence", in a word of "pride". "This pride is the source of many errors in Descartes' philosophy, according to Huet, for example the doctrine of created eternal truth" (p. 25).

Lennon believes it is difficult to decide between a "Pyrrhonian" and an "Academic" interpretation of Huet's positions. In other words he considers that it would be problematic to determine whether the arguments he puts forth surrounding substantial questions about the cogito, doubt, criteria, and the circularity of Meditations, make him "a Pyrrhonian interested in something other than the truth" (that is in the peace of the mind and in ataraxia), "or an honest Academic who just does not see it [the truth]" (p. 54). Although it is not closely linked to Huet's interpretation, what Lennon calls the "standard interpretation" of Descartes "supports his [Huet's] position by construing the linchpin argument of Descartes's system as a colossal failure". Apparently each of these two interpretations is the complete opposite of the other. Whereas for Huet, Descartes began as a sceptic but ended up as a dogmatic, for the "standard interpretation", here represented by Popkin and identified with the thesis of the "epistemological turn", although Descartes presented himself as the "conqueror of scepticism", he ended up becoming a "sceptique malgré lui" (to quote the titles of two chapters that Popkin dedicated to Descartes, Ch. 9 and Ch. 10). As is known, the question of the "absolute falsity" evoked in the Second Objections was more dissolved than resolved by Descartes, who liquidated it with an almost pragmatic resoluteness ("Why should this alleged 'absolute falsity' bother us, since we neither believe in it, nor have even the smallest suspicion of it?") -- but that is why Popkin takes it as the "objection of objections". In other words, despite the certainties proclaimed in Meditations, "there is a mismatch between our beliefs about the world and the world itself" (p. 59). In Lennon's view, this is a modern parallel of Huet's critique, since scepticism, never really having been overcome, becomes the "truth" underlying Descartes' apparent dogmatic posture.

One of the principal themes in Lennon's book (contra Popkin) "is not only that the standard interpretation is mistaken, but that no such lengths as those above need to be taken in the interpretation of Descartes". Lennon's approach is, as he himself says, "very deflationary, beginning with an interesting fact about texts: scepticism, at least as such, is not much talked about" (p. 61) and such references to it "as do appear are made incidentally". Lennon concludes: "The clear upshot is that scepticism is simply not important to Descartes as a threat, as an obstacle to overcome, or for any other reason. As a philosophy, Descartes has only contempt for scepticism" (p. 61). Now it is difficult to reconcile this statement with all the recent research that, going beyond Popkin's reconstruction, has tried to highlight the seventeenth-century context of scepticism. The error, made by much of the critical literature (but not by Popkin), has been to measure Descartes with the yardstick of the "ancient" forms of scepticism (be they Academic or Pyrrhonian), whereas the philosopher's main concern was clearly aimed at the forms of "modern" scepticism, as his replies to VII Objections show. In these, unlike his interlocutor Bourdin, Descartes is concerned not that doubt is too extensive, but that it is not extensive enough. Since he believes he must align himself not so much with the ancients but with "today's sceptics", whose characteristic is that of casting doubt on the existence of God and the soul, "pushing doubt beyond all limits", if he does not want to lay himself open to their derision, the philosopher must be equally radical in exercising doubt, to reach a demonstration of undoubted certainty. His interlocutors are neither the ancient Pyrrhonians with their isosthenia, nor the religiously-moderate Academics, but rather those whom Descartes calls the "sceptical atheists" and who were none other than the libertine sceptics of his time. Although, unlike many studies, Lennon carefully uses the VII Objections and the replies to them (see for example pp.71-72), he nevertheless fails to grasp the epistemological and metaphysical importance of this declaration of Descartes and he reduces it to an essentially moral question: "The problem, then, is not epistemological, but religious, and ultimately moral, especially since those doubting such truths were thought, correctly or not, to be liable to wild antinomianism" (p. 72). But are not objects like God and the soul first and foremost "metaphysical" (and as such the principal and declared objects of Meditations on First Philosophy)? And is not Cartesian metaphysics itself, for the very reason that it employs doubt even to the point of hyperbole, closely linked to the epistemological theme?

On the other hand, Lennon's peremptory liquidation of scepticism is effectively denied a few lines further on. After reminding readers of the evident truth that Descartes is not interested in doubt but in certainty, Lennon recognises: "Skepticism, at least skeptical argument, is a tool for arriving at certainty, and a touchstone of its authenticity" (p. 62). Thus the key position of the sceptical argument, which the previous sentences seemed to have definitively denied, is re-established.

The volume reviews all the main spheres on which Huet's criticism touched: the role and character of doubt, the rules to recognise evidence, the accusations of circularity (both in the relationship between the cogito and clarity and distinctness, and between the latter two and the demonstration of the existence of God), and the relationship between human knowledge and divine knowledge. It is impossible to examine all of these spheres in detail. For each sphere Lennon reconstructs, with clarity and remarkable historical penetration, not only Huet's position but also those of Descartes, his followers (Regis, Malebranche) and his interlocutors (Mersenne, Gassendi, Arnauld and in general the authors of the Objections). To illustrate the merits of Lennon's interpretation, I will concentrate on one point, in connection with which the book shows that Huet's criticism of Descartes reveals a total lack of understanding, deriving from the Bishop of Avranches' adherence to the canons of the ancient sceptical tradition, whereas Descartes carefully distances himself from this tradition. This is the classical question of the "criterion" and its validation. Huet intends clarity and distinctness as "criteria" of certainty and thus brings them within the famous trilemma of Sextus Empiricus (dogmatic arrest at the criterion itself, regression to infinity in the search for the criterion, vicious circle between demonstration and criterion), such as to impugn the validity of any criterion that may be selected. But in the case of Descartes -- continues Lennon -- the "standard label interpretation", whereby clarity and distinctness are to be understood as "detachable labels" that indicate criteria for the reliability of knowledge, does not hold. Although on this point Descartes' positions appear sometimes to oscillate, Lennon holds that the true novelty consists in using clarity and distinctness as adverbial forms that indicate the perception of truth: recte, evidenter. From this standpoint it would be a mistake to make them substantivates and use them, indeed, as though they were "labels", which would in turn require guarantees. Correctly, Lennon quotes Descartes' reply to Gassendi, from which it is clear that the very fact of having passed the test of doubt, of having thus eliminated all prejudice, leads to the evidence: thus to judge involves the responsibility of the subject in using judgment, and does not require a more or less automatic or artificial mechanism of guarantee (and of guarantee of the guarantee …), as the sceptics, Gassendi and Huet, would have liked. Elsewhere (pp. 200 ff.) Lennon states that Descartes' position suggests the notion of intentionality: "Intentionality is required, to put it simply, in order to be talking about something" (pp. 202-3).

The book ends with a section whose title ("Descartes as Methodological Academic Skeptic", pp. 242-4) might seem provocative, though in reality Lennon is referring to the Academic doctrine of "integra judicandi potestas" that implies the rejection of prejudice, the responsible use of judgment, and the exclusive commitment to the search for truth. In the final analysis, Descartes' response to "sceptics" like Huet is that "there is no formula for truth, or even for avoiding error", since "the truth ultimately is just seen". But just this "integrity" of judgment "is a matter of responsibility, of accepting ownership of one's judgments" (p. 242). Seen through the lens, often a deforming one, of scepticism, Descartes shows himself more than ever a Cartesian.

The volume is accompanied by a useful index nominum and also rerum; whereas it is a pity that references to the classical Adam Tannery edition of Descartes do not appear in the text, but only those to the English translation.