The Pleasures of Reason in Plato, Aristotle, and the Hellenistic Hedonists

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James Warren, The Pleasures of Reason in Plato, Aristotle, and the Hellenistic Hedonists, Cambridge University Press, 2014, 234pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107025448.


Reviewed by Tim O'Keefe, Georgia State University


This book begins with a look at a passage in Plato's Philebus that explores the contributions of reasoning and pleasure to a good life. Socrates and his interlocutor Protarchus agree that a good human life will involve both reasoning and pleasure. But reasoning and pleasure are not just two separate components of a good life, with a bit of reasoning here followed by an episode of pleasure there. Instead, as Warren puts it, "human reasoning gives rise to pleasures and pains of its own: there are pleasures of thinking, believing, learning, remembering, and so on." (2) Warren's volume explores these pleasures of reason.

Just as Socrates does in the Philebus, Warren uses the term "reasoning" (logismos) broadly. It spans theoretical reasoning, such as learning about and contemplating the workings of the world and the forms, remembering your past, anticipating your future, and deliberating. The first half of the book discusses the pleasures of theoretical reasoning in Plato, Aristotle, Epicurus, and Plutarch. The second half looks at deliberation and the pleasures of memory and anticipation in Plato, Aristotle, Epicurus, and the Cyrenaics.

The book has a thematic unity rather than an argumentative one. Warren doesn't attempt to establish an overall thesis; instead, he recounts what these philosophers say about various topics regarding the pleasures of reason. The chapters can mostly be read in isolation. Little of what Warren says in one place depends on what he says elsewhere, and he briefly recaps any needed context from previous chapters. But the book is not merely a collection of independent papers, although some chapters draw heavily from previous publications. Warren provides many cross-references to bind the chapters together, and reading the volume as a whole allows for fruitful comparisons among the figures he discusses.

The book is successful and should appeal to a wide readership. Warren is a clear and pleasingly efficient writer; what he says is reasonable and well-grounded in the texts. Unlike his earlier book on the Epicurean arguments regarding death (2004), Warren does not spend much time relating the ancient material to contemporary discussions of reason and pleasure. Nonetheless, what these philosophers say about reason and pleasure is not merely of historical interest, and the book would serve as a useful introduction to their theories for non-specialists. (Doubtful readers may look over the chapter summaries below and judge whether he is dealing with intriguing ancient insights or oddball antiquarian esoterica.) For specialists, although he doesn't break major new ground, Warren advances a number of judicious original proposals.

Chapter 1 sets out the main topics. It also includes a brief discussion of the relationship between reason and emotion since emotions are accompanied by pleasures and pains. Warren closes the chapter by considering how human and animal memory and anticipation compare to one another, focusing on what Aristotle says. Non-human animals have memory and anticipation of the future and thus pleasures and pains associated with these capacities. (A lion can deliberately pursue an ox and take pleasure in the prospect of devouring it, says Aristotle.) Nonetheless, humans remember the past and plan for and anticipate the future in qualitatively different ways. Unlike humans, other animals don't deliberate, their memories and anticipations of the future aren't under their voluntary control, and they have no conception of why what they are pursuing is good for them. And so, there are distinctively human and rational forms of the pleasures of memory and anticipation.

Chapter 2 deals with puzzles raised by the claims in the Republic and the Philebus that learning is a "pure" pleasure unaccompanied by pain and that the philosopher's life is the most pleasant. For Plato, pleasures are associated with processes of replenishing some deficiency, whether bodily or psychic. Most pleasures are mixed with pain because you are aware of the painful deficiency being remedied; an example is eating when hungry. But some pleasures are "pure." They are processes but aren't preceded or accompanied by painful awareness of deficiency; an example is enjoying the smell of pine trees during a stroll.

The first puzzle is that learning is often painful. Warren brings up Socratic cross-examination; having your beliefs tested can be unpleasant. And he claims that the education of the philosopher-kings in the Republic will be accompanied "by pains, frustrations and the like which are essentially connected with the fact that there is a conscious desire to know or understand something as yet un-grasped." (24)

Warren resolves this puzzle by noting that ignorance and foolishness are psychic deficiencies but are not per se painful; they are painful only when you are aware of them. More precisely, Warren gives two necessary and jointly sufficient conditions for lack of knowledge to be painful: "(i) the lack of knowledge must be noticed or reflected upon and (ii) the knowledge that is lacking must be recognized as needed or necessary in some way." (25) So the process of learning, of remedying your psychic deficiency, need not be mixed with pain. (Warren's solution has the consequence that learning is a "mixed" pleasure for self-aware philosophers and a pure pleasure only for those who do not know that they do not know or at least don't know that their ignorance is bad.)

The second puzzle concerns whether the life of a philosopher is pleasant. According to Plato, pleasures are kinēseis, or changes -- in particular, processes of replenishment. So, it looks like the philosopher who is still learning enjoys intellectual pleasures, but the philosopher in the state of having achieved wisdom doesn't. Besides being an unwelcome consequence, Socrates suggests elsewhere that there are pleasures of knowing and of contemplating the forms.

Warren devises a nifty solution. (46-51) Plato restricts pleasures to processes that involve changes in their subjects. But, says Warren, even knowledgeable philosophers undergo psychic changes. In the Philebus, Socrates distinguishes between relearning something you've forgotten versus calling to mind something you hadn't forgotten but weren't focusing on. And even philosophers with knowledge of the forms aren't constantly attending to this knowledge, e.g., when they're sleeping, eating, engaging in the city's business. But when they can, they'll recall their knowledge. This shifting of attention is a process of change. (Warren notes that God doesn't change like this and so experiences no pleasure -- a consequence Socrates avows in the Philebus.)

Chapter 3 recaps the ways Aristotle modifies Plato's position, but Warren stresses the continuity between the two, especially their joint commitment to "the value and importance of the pleasures that comes from rational activities and the close connection between the possession or active use of knowledge and the fulfillment of the best parts of our human nature." (53) He summarizes Aristotle's doctrine that pleasure is not a kinēsis but an activity (energeia) that doesn't involve change or coming-to-be. This allows God and the wise person engaging in contemplation to experience pleasure. He also notes Aristotle's doctrine that the value of an activity depends on the value of its object, i.e., how noble or fine (kalon) it is. (61) This allows Aristotle to reaffirm Plato's doctrine that intellectual activities and intellectual pleasures are the best.

The chapter includes a nice discussion of wonder and its connection with pleasure and the desire to learn in the Rhetoric, Poetics, and Metaphysics. Warren rightly notes that for Aristotle there are intellectual pleasures (including aesthetic pleasures) available to people who have not achieved theoretical wisdom.

As a hedonist, Epicurus denies that knowledge is valuable per se. Instead, it has value only insofar as it makes our lives pleasant. Chapter 4 explores how theoretical knowledge relates to pleasure for Epicurus. We can distinguish two ways. Knowledge may be merely instrumentally pleasant. For example, if I know that the gods have nothing to do with the workings of the world and that death is annihilation, this knowledge will help me shed my superstitious fears of the gods and death and thus attain peace of mind. Or knowledge may be intrinsically pleasant. I may find thinking about the atomic explanation for thunderbolts pleasant per se apart from how this knowledge helps me stop worrying that Zeus will zap me.

Warren acknowledges that for Epicurus theoretical knowledge promotes happiness primarily by its instrumental contribution to peace of mind. Nonetheless, he says, "there are also indications that Epicurus envisaged a more direct relationship between knowledge of the nature of things and pleasure." (80) The Epicurean Lucretius says he feels awe and divine pleasure at beholding the wondrous workings of the universe, as revealed by Epicurus (DRN 3 27 -- 29), and Epicurus himself says that the process of learning is pleasurable, that "pleasure and learning are simultaneous." (SV 27) Warren claims that this simultaneity shows that "I do not need to wait for that knowledge to be useful or to lead to some later pleasure; it is pleasant all by itself" (81).

Warren significantly understates the difficulties with thinking that for Epicurus knowledge is pleasurable per se. Texts like Principal Doctrines 11 and 12 do not state merely that knowledge of the world is necessary for dispelling superstition and that this function is the "principal contribution that these intellectual pursuits can make to the production of pleasure," (80) as Warren puts it. Instead, Principal Doctrine 11 says that if we were not troubled by our ignorance of the limits of our desires and by our suspicions regarding heavenly phenomena and death, then we'd have no need for natural science. This suggests that natural science has only instrumental value via dispelling these fears and limiting our desires and isn't something we find immediately pleasant. Likewise, Epicurus states that the only goal of achieving knowledge of physics and celestial phenomena is attaining freedom from disturbance. (Letter to Pythocles 85) Warren claims that for Epicurus "knowing that the lightning is caused in such-and-so a way is just pleasant all by itself." (82) But in his doctrine of multiple explanations, Epicurus states that we often cannot know the precise cause of some celestial phenomenon. When this is the case, as long as we have a disjunction of possible naturalistic explanations that allow us to rule out the involvement of the gods, knowing which disjunct is the correct explanation is irrelevant as far as achieving peace of mind, and the person who has achieved only the disjunctive knowledge ("Lightning is caused by X, or Y, or Z . . . ") is just as free from disturbance as he would be if he knew it occurred in some particular way. (Letter to Herodotus 79-80)

The latter part of chapter 4 ably recounts the polemic of the Platonist Plutarch against the Epicurean doctrines concerning pleasure and reason. Warren draws connections between Plutarch and various passages in Plato's dialogues, while noting that for Plutarch, intellectual pleasures are wider than merely those connected to knowledge of unchanging forms and include the pleasures of literature, history, and other social and cultural pursuits that deal with contingent particulars.

Chapters 5 and 6 look at what Plato says about pleasures of anticipation: in particular, Plato's doctrine that there are "false pleasures." Warren first presents the "measuring art" described in the Protagoras and notes some of its ambiguities. (For instance, its weighing procedure "does not amount to a full recipe for pleasure-maximization," (111) the precise source of our bias toward temporally near pleasures isn't specified, (113) and the account leaves open how often to employ the measuring art: for every choice or just some? (116)) In any case, correcting for our temporal biases and clearly weighing the pleasures and pains resulting from our actions is supposed to secure us happiness.

Warren then turns to the pleasures and pains of "the comparative procedure itself," (120) e.g., the pleasure I now feel because I believe that I will receive great wealth and thereby experience great pleasure in the future, and the associated doctrine in the Philebus that some of these pleasures are based on mistakes and hence are "false pleasures." He notes that the most plausible interpretation of the Philebus holds that pleasures themselves have some sort of propositional content, (130) so that my pleasure is partially constituted by a judgment about the future.

Warren says that Socrates' claim that for the most part the false pleasures he is discussing aren't experienced by just and pious people is key to understanding "false pleasures." Consider the person who anticipates that he is going to get lots of wealth and thereby obtain many pleasures. He pictures to himself both getting the wealth and enjoying getting it. If he is experiencing a false pleasure, this picture is mistaken. But, says Warren, it's implausible to suppose that the mistakes vicious people make typically involve having false beliefs about what will occur (that he'll get the wealth) as that mistake is not "a specifically ethical failure in the person's character" (137). Instead, because of their depravity, impious and unjust people make mistakes about what will please them. Warren aptly compares them to the tyrannical person depicted in the Republic. Like them, he is thoroughly unjust, impious, and miserable -- not because his expectations about the future are constantly confounded but because he doesn't find it satisfying to obtain the objects of his lawless appetites. (140) Warren then goes on to consider the role reason plays for Plato in making a human life unified, harmonious, and pleasant.

In chapter 7 Warren shows how Aristotle appropriates the Philebus' doctrines but modifies them in salutary ways. In Nicomachean Ethics 9.4, Aristotle echoes the Republic and the Philebus: the bad person is full of internal dissension and so hates spending time with himself. Because of his regrets and poor prospects, both his memories and expectations of the future are painful. In these ways he is an enemy to himself. The good person, conversely, is his own best friend: he loves himself, is in harmony with himself, and both his memories and expectations of the future are pleasurable.

But Aristotle complicates the doctrine that memories and expectations of pain are painful, whereas memories and expectations of pleasure are pleasurable. This is generally true, but Aristotle holds that sometimes we recall with pleasure painful events that are followed by what is good. Warren notes that Aristotle doesn't make entirely clear why this happens (168), so he considers at length the passage that Aristotle uses to illustrate his thesis: Eumaeus the swineherd recounting how he was taken from his birthplace and sold into slavery to Odysseus' father. Warren concludes that the most common explanation, though not the only one, for someone recalling a past pain with pleasure is that he "now sees and understands those events as being beneficial and good -- hence pleasant -- whereas he originally saw them as harmful and painful." (174)

In the final chapter -- leaving aside a brief epilogue -- Warren summarizes the Epicurean hedonic calculus, whereby a person prudently picks and chooses among pleasures and pains to make his life overall as pleasant as possible. He also discusses the view of the Cyrenaics, fellow hedonists who eschew careful planning regarding the future and instead recommend concentrating on present pleasures. It's sharply debated why the Cyrenaics make this recommendation. A related debate is whether the Cyrenaic break with eudaimonism, the view that eudaimonia (happiness) is the highest good. (Among other texts, this is based on a report that the Cyrenaics claim that eudaimonia is just a collection of particular pleasures and that particular pleasure, not eudaimonia, is the goal (telos) and is worth choosing for its own sake. They also that say accumulating the pleasures that would produce happiness is most troublesome. (DL 2.87-90))

Against interpreters like Terence Irwin and Tim O'Keefe, Warren thinks the Cyrenaics don't sharply break with eudaimonism. According to Warren, the Cyrenaics oppose careful planning just because such planning is generally ineffective as the future is uncertain. Interestingly, he doesn't connect this "uncertainty" to the Cyrenaics' epistemological pessimism, their doctrine that we can know our own affections but not their causes in the world. Instead, he gives ethical reasons to explain the differing attitudes of the Epicureans and Cyrenaics about planning for the future and pleasures of anticipation.

For Epicurus, tranquility is pleasurable and the main constituent of a happy life. He advocates limiting your desires so you can easily satisfy them and face the future with serene confidence. So, given his limited desires, an Epicurean will be on firmer ground in having pleasurable expectations about the future and expecting that it will conform to his desires. The Cyrenaics, however, ridicule the state of being free from all bodily pain and mental turmoil as the condition of a corpse, not the height of pleasure, and they have little truck with reducing their desires to attain tranquility. And so, they won't be in a secure position to expect that their desires will be fulfilled. (209)

In fact, the Cyrenaics advocate "prerehearsing" future suffering. While Epicurus thinks that anticipating future suffering is itself painful, the Cyrenaics think that unanticipated suffering is especially painful, and so reminding yourself that some future evil event will occur will make the event less painful when it arrives. (203) In Warren's pithy summary of the Cyrenaics' recommendations, "assume and expect that pain will come; enjoy the present while you can." (204)

Warren's topic and the group of philosophers he focuses on are well chosen. The topic is distinctive and the philosophers help illuminate one another. The Pleasures of Reason deals skillfully with a wide range of material in a short span.


Irwin, T. 1991. "Aristippus against happiness," The Monist 74: 55-82.

O'Keefe, T. 2002. "The Cyrenaics on pleasure, happiness, and future-concern," Phronesis 47: 395-416.

Warren, J. 2004. Facing Death: Epicurus and His Critics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.