The Political Morality of Liberal Democracy

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Michael J. Perry, The Political Morality of Liberal Democracy, Cambridge UP, 2010, 216pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521115186.

Reviewed by James Boettcher, Saint Joseph's University



Political philosophers are fond of celebrating various civic virtues including the need for citizens to subject their political judgments to deliberative critical scrutiny. Yet the tendency stubbornly to defend our own theoretical reflections on political life suggests that remaining fully open to the force of the better argument is far from easy. A footnote to The Political Morality of Liberal Democracy recalls Meister Eckhart’s insight: “Only the hand that erases can write the true thing” (4, n. 12). With eraser in hand, Michael Perry has spent well over two decades writing about — and, in the process, adjusting his account of — the proper political role of religion in liberal democracy. Especially insofar as public intellectuals should exhibit the attitudes and dispositions they would expect of citizens, Perry’s willingness not only to revise but sometimes altogether to reject positions set forth in his earlier works is admirable.

The relation between religion and politics is the unifying theme of The Political Morality of Liberal Democracy, and the book introduces at least one notable change to Perry’s view. Yet long-time readers of Perry will also find much that is familiar on several topics, including human rights, constitutional interpretation, and morally charged political controversies like abortion and same-sex marriage. Indeed, the scope of the project appears to be broader than originally intended, addressing most of the major themes from Perry’s past writings, now comprising over ten books and numerous articles. The result is a work that examines the “grounding, content, implications, and judicial enforcement” of the political morality of liberal democracy, with the book’s four parts nicely organized around these “four aspects” of political morality (3).

In Part I (Chapters 1-2) Perry examines the morality of human rights that serves as the normative foundation of liberal democracy. This morality consists of two fundamental claims: First, that each human being has equal inherent dignity; second, that we must not violate other human beings by failing to respect their basic moral status in our commitments and actions. These two propositions concerning inherent dignity and inviolability are what ground the rights — understood as justified claims to requirements or prohibitions — specified in various international covenants and entrenched in liberal constitutional orders. Affirming this morality means recognizing both negative and positive duties not only to prevent egregious violations of human rights but also to respond adequately to those at risk of serious and unwarranted human suffering.

Perry provides a useful framework for understanding and evaluating human rights claims, though he generally avoids debates about precisely which rights should be included in a standard package of international human rights. Thus readers will not find a detailed discussion of the normative status of controversial social rights or of collective rights to culture and other so-called third-generation rights. Instead Perry returns to a question addressed in his earlier work, namely, whether there is an ineliminably religious dimension to the morality of human rights. He first explains that there are sufficient religious reasons for supporting this morality, relying on the example of a fictional citizen named “Sarah.” Sarah’s commitment to the inherent dignity and inviolability of human beings is based on her convictions that every human being is sacred and a beloved child of God and that in loving God and others we “fulfill our created nature” and realize our “authentic well-being” (34-9). In a second step, Perry casts doubt on the assumption that the inherent dignity and inviolability claims can be vindicated by those espousing secular worldviews, especially views according to which the universe is “finally and radically” meaningless (47). Expressing a contemporary — and, to be sure, more tolerant — version of Locke’s worry that only religious faith can sustain a suitable political morality, Perry writes that “[n]o plausible secular argument supports” the claim that each has conclusive reason always to abide by the demand to respect the inherent dignity of all (53).

While Perry’s sketch of a religiously based morality of human rights seems quite plausible, his case against a secular grounding of human rights is less so. A first question concerns the very distinction between the religious and the secular. In particular, it is not clear whether Perry thinks that all worldviews that purport to explain the meaningfulness of the universe are in some sense religious (43). After all, not all “secular” worldviews are guided by philosophical naturalism or by “Nietzsche’s thought” that there is “no metaphysical order of any kind” (51, citing Bernard Williams). Second, the case against a secular grounding would be stronger if the most promising philosophical arguments in support of the morality of human rights had been conclusively defeated. Consider well-known (and controverted) attempts to justify something like Perry’s dignity and inviolability claims on the basis of rationality, autonomy, the implications of having a practical identity, or realism about moral reasons and their intrinsic authority. Perry does not adequately engage these positions directly, and readers will want to know more about why such arguments supposedly fail. Finally, one worries that Perry has applied more demanding epistemic standards to potential secular groundings of human rights as compared to religious ones. For example, Perry suggests that secularists who would identify the dignity and inviolability claims as properly basic — or, as he puts it, “bedrock” — must continue to ask “what ”“>else must be true” if these claims are assumed to be true (54). He then notes that secular responses to this challenge will be “deficient” (54, n. 75, citing Steve Smith). Yet why should we assume that nonreligious ethical theories must be less coherent or credible than Sarah’s belief in God, eudaimonistic conception of authentic well-being, and other fundamental religious convictions, none of which are thoroughly scrutinized and some of which are allowed to remain not “fully understood” (36)?

Part II of the book is more convincing in its exploration of the “first principles” of liberal-democratic political morality. These principles include the right to moral equality (Chapter 3), the right to religious freedom (Chapter 4), and the right to moral freedom (Chapter 5). The right to moral equality guards against laws and policies, such as de jure racial segregation, that would treat some human beings as inferiors, i.e., as lacking equal dignity or interests that merit equal concern and respect. Laws implicating this right are said also to violate it when they fail to serve a legitimate and sufficiently weighty governmental interest that is proportionate to the costs imposed on those subject to the law (64). A similar standard must be met if government is to ban or impede religious practice, and Perry explicitly rules out the protection of religious truth or unity as legitimate governmental interests. Indeed, with respect to both religion and morality, he argues that democratic political majorities are not to be trusted as arbiters of truth and that attempts to impose religious and moral uniformity are likely to be ineffective and divisive. Nor should morally motivated practices be outlawed simply because they are thought to undermine a society’s supposed moral “health” (94). Perry concludes that the right to moral freedom — that is, “the right to freedom to live one’s life in harmony with one’s moral convictions and commitments” — is both “analogous to” and a “compelling extension of” the fundamental liberal-democratic right to religious freedom (89, 96).

The final chapter of Part II is entitled “Religion as a Basis of Lawmaking,” familiar territory for Perry and the principal theme of several earlier books dating back to his highly instructive Love and Power (1991). Chapter 6 takes up a number of related but distinct questions about both the United States and liberal democracy in general. First, does the nonestablishment norm of the U.S. Constitution forbid government from affirming religious premises? Perry argues that the central meaning of the norm is that government cannot privilege any particular church in relation to other churches. It follows that the nonestablishment norm prohibits official affirmation of some but not all religious premises, namely, those premises that would contravene its central meaning by privileging a particular church or its doctrines and worship practices. Thus governmental endorsement of sectarian premises would be unconstitutional, but nonsectarian references to God in the Pledge of Allegiance, on U.S. currency, and at the beginning of court proceedings are constitutionally permissible. Of course such references are hardly the stuff of our more urgent struggles for justice, and so a second question specifically targets important matters of coercive and/or discriminatory law and policy: does the Constitution’s nonestablishment norm ban laws and policies “for which the only discernible rationale (other than an implausible secular rationale) is religious?” (114).

Perry’s answer to this question is a highly qualified ‘yes.’ Here he seems to depart from the less restrictive position defended in his Under God? (2003), though he stops short of returning to the more restrictive position advanced even earlier in his Religion in Politics (1997). Perry’s considered view is that the nonestablishment norm should be understood to ban only those laws that necessarily depend on a sectarian religious premise that government may not affirm. Yet, he adds, as a practical-political matter there are likely to be few such laws, that is, laws for which the only plausible, discernible rationale is a religious justification that violates the norm’s central meaning. (One possible exception would be laws that disfavor same-sex couples, a topic to which Perry returns in a subsequent chapter.) A third question is whether the nonestablishment norm forbids individual lawmakers from relying on an “offending” religious justification in their political choices. Perry argues that even though the norm should be understood in principle to ban some laws, it should not be construed as a direct constitutional limit on the activity of individual legislators. This latter stricture would not only be exceedingly difficult for courts to enforce, it would also yield adverse political consequences (116).

A fourth question is whether liberal democracy as such, even those democracies with no constitutionally entrenched nonestablishment norm, should avoid adopting coercive laws for which the only plausible rationale is religious. Perry maintains that they should avoid laws of this sort, which essentially “impose” religion on some citizens and thereby violate their right to religious freedom (119). This conclusion certainly has implications for a final question unfortunately not addressed in the chapter, namely, whether the moral requirements of citizenship instruct citizens and officials to refrain from relying solely on religious reasoning in their political advocacy and choice. In Under God? Perry had argued against a moral requirement of restraint. Yet one wonders whether that position is ultimately still consistent with his more recent account of religious and moral freedom. After all, Perry suggests that the right to moral freedom serves not only as the basis of legal rights but also as a “fundamental political-moral norm” that should inform the “political culture” of liberal democracy (99). If voting citizens and officials recognize this norm and also realize that some coercive laws without secular justification would impose religion, should they not as a matter of moral duty or virtue exercise a measure of restraint when they can identify no adequate secular (or, perhaps, public) reason for their favored laws and policies? It would seem that they should.

In Part III (Chapters 7-8) Perry’s first principles are applied to the issues of abortion and same-sex unions. Does a ban on pre-viability abortions, subject to certain exceptions, violate the right to moral freedom? The answer depends, first, on whether the ban is necessary to serve a legitimate and sufficiently weighty governmental interest that is not disproportionately burdensome. Second, there must be a plausible secular rationale in support of the conclusion that the ban is necessary (124). Perry’s focus is on the second question, and he presents such a rationale (about which he remains “agnostic”): if every born human being has inherent dignity, and if there is no good reason for settling on a specific point after fertilization when unborn human life acquires that status, then unborn human life is presumed to have inherent dignity warranting legal protection. Perry’s goal is not to decide the abortion issue by demonstrating that this reasoning is “ultimately persuasive”; rather, the argument that he examines is said to be both plausible and nonreligious, and so the policy it calls for is to that extent consistent with the right to moral freedom (136).

By contrast, refusal to provide official recognition to same-sex unions does amount to a violation of moral freedom. Perry surveys the main arguments often adduced publicly in support of nonrecognition — e.g., that refusing to extend equal benefits to same-sex couples is necessary to protect “traditional marriage” — and concludes that these arguments are not only empirically faulty and unconvincing but utterly implausible (146). They often simply conceal the real motivation behind such refusals, namely, the notion that same-sex unions are immoral. This latter judgment does not specify a legitimate governmental interest consistent with the right to moral freedom. Moreover, the only arguments that could plausibly account for the judgment that same-sex unions are immoral depend on sectarian religious premises, and are not a permissible basis for nonrecognition according to both the nonestablishment norm and the political morality of liberal democracy. Indeed Chapter 8’s forceful defense of the rights of same-sex couples is implicit throughout the book, serving as an illustrative example in several earlier chapters and occupying Perry’s attention again in the book’s short “Conclusion.” There Perry cites the right to moral equality in support of a recent Florida court ruling according to which a law barring gays and lesbians from becoming adoptive parents violates the state constitution’s equal protection clause. Perry concludes that a reversal of this decision granting equal adoption rights would be “So shameful as to later warrant both embarrassment and apology” (203).

The topic of anti-discrimination protection is also germane to the central question of Chapter 9, the book’s longest chapter and the only one focusing on judicial enforcement and constitutional theory (Part IV). The U.S. Supreme Court has the power of “judicial ”SpellE">ultimacy“; its decisions about the constitutionality of a law cannot be overruled by ordinary legislation. Hence the question: How should that power be exercised? Drawing on the thought of the nineteenth-century jurist James Bradley Thayer, Perry suggests that the Court’s orientation is ”">deferential when it is “prepared to rule that a challenged law does not violate a constitutionally entrenched human rights norm if the claim that the law does not violate the norm is reasonable” (164). Thus only those laws based on a “clear mistake” will be found unconstitutional (165). A judicial orientation is nondeferential when judges rely on their own “specification” of constitutional norms to overturn a challenged law even if there is a reasonable counter-claim that no rights violation has occurred. Perry suggests that the deliberative-democratic case for judicial deference is strong and so it is a generally appropriate orientation. However, there are two areas in which the Court should remain nondeferential: the protection of the right to political freedom and the right to moral equality. Safeguarding these rights is internally connected to the very meaning of liberal-democratic political cooperation.

Although a “Postscript” to Chapter 9 takes up several other questions about constitutional interpretation, readers are probably well advised to turn to Perry’s other writings for a better sense of his fully elaborated view. As with the discussion of religion and human rights, a chapter-length treatment cannot explore all of the most relevant issues and arguments. Nevertheless, The Political Morality of Liberal Democracy is an important and timely book, with much to offer those working in political philosophy and constitutional law. It brings together in a unified theory the many ideas of one of our most distinguished commentators on the proper role of religion in law and political life.