The Political Morality of the Late Scholastics: Civic Life, War and Conscience

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Daniel Schwartz, The Political Morality of the Late Scholastics: Civic Life, War and Conscience, Cambridge University Press, 2019, 234pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781108492454.

Reviewed by Sydney Penner, Asbury University


Sometimes texts from a different time can seem foreign. Imagine you are being tortured on the rack. You are suspected of having used bribes to gain advantages for your business, and so now you are being tortured in order to elicit a confession from you. What moral questions might we ask of this situation? Here is one obvious one: is using torture to elicit confessions an acceptable practice? Thomas Cajetan (1469-1534), however, pursues a different question: is it morally permissible to confess in order to prevent or stop torture? Though a standard one for late scholastics, the question itself is likely startling enough to a twenty-first century reader. But Cajetan's answer -- not standard, it should be noted -- is even more astonishing. It is not permissible to confess, even truly, he argues, because self-defamation is wrong in a way analogous to suicide. Self-defamation deprives your community of a good -- your good reputation -- and so confessing to a sin is an action wrong in kind and so is not permissible even under torture. There is something monstrous about a system that permits torture to elicit confessions and yet is morally delicate enough to worry that confessing under torture is wrong. Nevertheless, Schwartz is right in the present book to draw our attention to an interesting issue in the background: how we should think about our reputations (p. 83). Is my reputation analogous to my money, a private possession of which I can dispose as I please, or does my community have some claim to my reputation? After all, losing a good reputation excludes some ways for me to contribute to the common good. This is an issue worth considering, but is one that had never occurred to this reader at least until I had traveled to the past where "they do things differently."

Sometimes texts from a different time can seem remarkably familiar. Bad harvests early in the sixteenth century led to large numbers of destitute peasants migrating to the cities, where they frequently ended up on the streets begging. There seems to have been a general recognition that the poor had some kind of right to minimal provisioning, but the migration of people from one area to another led to heated disputes about a city's responsibility to the foreign poor. There were widespread concerns that some of the poor were merely lazy or even that some of them were secretly wealthy but posing as poor in order to collect alms. Distinguishing those genuinely in need was deemed harder in the case of the foreign poor than with those living in their hometown. People also worried that the foreign poor would bring disease, corruption, and social dissension. Some thought the domestic poor have a greater claim in principle to a city's resources than the foreign poor. Others, however, argued that laws designed to keep the foreign poor at bay are unjust because the poor have a legitimate claim to help and we know well enough that some will not receive that help in their hometowns. Furthermore, making their hometowns shoulder all the responsibility is itself unjust because there is great disparity in natural wealth from one region to another, and so expecting all towns to take care of their own in effect imposes a much greater burden on some towns than on others. Allowing the migration of the poor can help distribute that burden more equally.

The similarities between the sixteenth-century discussion of the foreign poor and discussion in our time about immigration are obvious. There is, however, still room for surprise in some of the details. When Domingo de Soto (1494-1560) argues against exclusionary poor laws, he makes use of the Pauline image of all Christians belonging to one body but having different functions in that body. The wise are like the eyes of the body, the strong like the arms and legs, and so on. The wealthy? They are the stomach. Their function is to extract nutrients and deliver them to the rest of the body. Consequently, by "making themselves unapproachable to the foreign poor, the rich fail to perform their social nutritive function" (p. 72). One wonders how a talk explaining that the function of the wealthy is to be the stomach of the social body would be received at the next meeting of the World Economic Forum in Davos.

Those are two of the issues whose sixteenth and seventeenth century discussions Schwartz examines. A characteristic genre of books in the period consisted of more or less independent treatments of a series of controversial issues. These treatments are often provoked by events and debates outside academia rather than being test applications of a systematic philosophy. Advantages of such an approach include a richness of texture and obvious practical relevance. A disadvantage is precisely the lack of systematicity and consequently the occasional sense that authors help themselves to a principle in one discussion that they deny in another. For better or worse, Schwartz follows this genre with a book that consists of a set of independent chapters, each covering one issue, though with a subset of loosely related chapters that fall broadly under just war theory (p. 9).

In addition to the two mentioned issues, Schwartz includes chapters on the ethics of electoral bribing (motivated by the widespread view that the best candidates have a right to votes), on the morality of tax evasion, on the morality of painting portraits for clients likely to use them for sinful purposes, on the permissibility of setting aside one's doubts about a war's justice when called to fight, on the permissibility of a polity surrendering a citizen to the enemy in order to save itself, on how to block the possibility of both sides having just cause for war in a probabilist framework, and on post-victory justice. Space precludes discussing each in turn here.

If the book has an overall thesis, it is that the examined discussions show that late scholastic literature contains many sophisticated, interesting disputes well worth our acquaintance. The case for that thesis is convincing. Note, however, that one kind of value often ascribed to the history of philosophy -- namely, that historical texts offer synoptic or comprehensive philosophies that reveal connections that may elude us if we read only the narrowly focused articles of contemporary analytic philosophy journals -- is not likely to be found either in Schwartz's book or in many of the primary texts he is considering. This is precisely because late scholastic literature in many ways resembles the professionalized philosophy of our day, and shares in the same virtues and vices. For synoptic visions, late scholastic works are not the best place to turn. On the other hand, if one is looking for precisely defined distinctions designed to deal with difficult cases, they are perfect.

A note about the term 'late scholastic'. Schwartz uses it for roughly the same group of theologians and philosophers that also go under the names 'Baroque scholasticism', 'early modern scholasticism', and 'second scholasticism': namely, the theologians and philosophers working in university contexts in the sixteenth, seventeenth, and early eighteenth centuries (p. 5). As part of the title of his book, 'late scholastic' is perhaps somewhat misleading, since Schwartz mostly looks at the Roman Catholic theologians active in Spain and Portugal. The most frequently appearing figures are all Spanish: Francisco de Vitoria (1486-1546), Domingo de Soto, Luis de Molina (1535-1600), Francisco Suárez (1548-1617), and Gabriel Vázquez (1549-1604). Numerous other figures also make significant appearances. Schwartz's focus is perfectly reasonable. Covering all of scholasticism, both Catholic and Protestant, in Europe and elsewhere in the world, would be unmanageable, and the Iberian peninsula was arguably preeminent in theology and philosophy at the time. That said, especially in the case of moral controversies situated in events of the day, it would be interesting to know if different cultural sensibilities left their mark in different regions. For example, Schwartz notes that the heavy tax burden faced by the Spanish along with an accompanying custom of not reporting transactions but only paying taxes on demand likely affected Spanish theologians' discussions of tax evasion (pp. 33-34, 55). This raises the question whether there were places with lower tax burdens and different customs and whether theologians in those areas held different views about the morality of tax evasion.

My main complaint about the book is its excessive brevity. Journal articles written for fellow specialists often proceed with minimal explanation, but a book should allow for more expansiveness. The book -- unsurprisingly, given its subjects -- is replete with technical distinctions and terms. Many are briefly characterized, but I expect some of the discussions will feel dense even to many readers with considerable familiarity with scholasticism. For example, when introducing taxonomies of conscience, we go in three sentences from Antonio de Córdoba's distinction between faith, opinion, scruple, and doubt to Juan Azor's putatively parallel distinction between erroneous, opinative, doubtful, and scrupulous conscience to Gregory Sayer's distinction between rightful, erroneous, doubtful, probable, and scrupulous conscience. If Córdoba and Azor are offering parallel distinctions, how do we get from faith to erroneous conscience? What motivates Sayer's five-fold distinction? How are we to understand the relationship between the five members? Are they not cross-cutting distinctions? Answering these questions may not strictly be necessary for Schwartz's purposes; nevertheless, more extensive explanation and motivation would have made the book friendlier.

In some cases, a more in-depth examination of terms and images might have shed light on how key claims were understood. Consider the body politic. Thanks to a number of ancient references and then John of Salisbury's extensive development of the image in his Policraticus, medieval authors frequently compare republics and other social organizations to the human body. But what should one make of the organicist analogy? Schwartz notes in passing on several occasions that late scholastics, including Soto, reject the organicist analogy, at least if taken in a way that implies that a citizen can be sacrificed for the republic in the way that a limb can be sacrificed for the human body (e.g., pp. 146 and 200). The entirely plausible claim is that citizens have individual rights in a way that parts of the body do not. But recall that we saw earlier that Soto makes use of an organicist analogy when arguing that the wealthy -- the stomach of the social body -- are obliged to aid the poor. Is Soto simply inconsistent? Or is there a more subtle position that can be ascribed to him?

Suárez distinguishes four kinds of unity in his metaphysics, and says that a republic has an intermediate kind of unity somewhere between the unity enjoyed by an individual human being and the lack of unity of a pile of clothes on the floor (Disputationes metaphysicae 4.3.14). Maybe Soto could avail himself of a position such as this and say that a citizen is not quite like a body part but not entirely independent either. As a matter of metaphysics, attributing a kind of intermediate unity to a republic seems quite plausible. It is less clear to me, however, what moral implications one would draw from this. Nevertheless, it seems a direction worth pursuing.

Excessive brevity aside, Schwartz has provided a well-informed introduction to a set of discussions from a vibrant philosophical tradition about which most of us are largely ignorant. He is a reliable guide, familiar with both an impressive selection of scholastic texts and with more of the historical and cultural context than can always be expected from philosophers. Schwartz is to be commended for retrieving these discussions and bringing them to wider attention.