The Political Ontology of Giorgio Agamben: Signatures of Life and Power

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German Eduardo Primera, The Political Ontology of Giorgio Agamben: Signatures of Life and Power, Bloomsbury, 2019, 197pp., $141.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781350081369.

Reviewed by Thomas Carl Wall, National Taipei University of Technology


Giorgio Agamben does not acquiesce to the traditional distinction between poetry and philosophy (or for that matter, between theological and political thought, political thought and metaphysics (which German Eduardo Primera’s book foregrounds), or history and poetry). He writes, in his very early work Stanzas: Word and Phantasm in Western Culture [originally published in 1977; not translated into English until 1993], “of a scission stemming from the origin of our culture that is usually accepted as the most natural thing — that goes, so to speak, without saying — but in fact is the only thing truly worth interrogating. The scission in question is that between poetry and philosophy” (xvii). Agamben’s entire career could in great part be understood as negotiation between this and other poles of serious linguistic practices.

Primera foregrounds this scission early in the book (36-44) and employs it as part of a commanding attempt to defend Agamben against numerous straightforward political philosophers who aren’t interested in the scission. He neatly defines what Agamben is attempting as an “isolation of the improper” (36), which is the first of his many nuanced ways to re-think the Agamben phenomenon against numerous criticisms from such thinkers as Antonio Negri, Alberto Toscano, Roberto Esposito, and Jessica Whyte. Agamben attracts a lot of critics. In addition to the defenses, Primera examines one-by-one Agamben’s own extrication of his thought from its potential intrication with Derrida’s grammatology, from Carl Schmitt’s political theology, and from Foucault’s bio-politics. It is an enormous task that Primera has taken on, but he is not alone. His attempt to demonstrate fundamental conceptual clarity in this volume joins William Watkin’s Agamben and Indifference: A Critical Overview [2014], which Primera cites innumerable times throughout his study (in fact more times than are listed in the index), Sergei Prozorov’s Agamben and Politics: A Critical Introduction  [2014] (also frequently cited), and Leland de la Durantaye’s Giorgio Agamben: A Critical Introduction [2009]. Primera’s attempt is based principally on a variety of ‘signatures’ that complicate but at the same time unify Agamben’s wide ranging and ever-deepening intellectual journey, a significant and highly controversial portion of which — the decades long Homo Sacer project — is now complete (or, he says, “abandoned”) with the publication of The Use of Bodies [2014/2015].

The first of the seven chapters deals with Agamben’s overall methodology which is a “philosophical archaeology”, including paradigms and exemplifications. this methodology, Primera astutely examines this methodology, which is illustrated in Agamben’s early engagement with Derrida (a subject x-rayed at length and in exquisite detail in a somewhat different way by Keven Attell in his Giorgio Agamben: Beyond the Threshold of Deconstruction [2015] ), which was begun in Stanzas, and also quite pointedly in his pedagogically dramatized - The First Day Excursus; The Second Day- Excursus; and so on through eight “Days” — and philosophically dense Language and Death [1982/1991]. Agamben has dramatized his scholarly discoveries throughout his career (the introduction to his Homo Sacer: Sovereign Power and Bare Life [1995/1998] (1-12) is perhaps the most prominent example), which is something Primera does not highlight, but ought to have, considering his own intellectual foregrounding of Agamben’s complication of the traditional separation of poetry and philosophy. I think the one overall weakness in Primera’s book is a devaluation of the language of poetry’s separation from philosophy in favor of the strictly intellectual or the philosophical, which is contrary to Agamben’s openly stated interrogation of the distinction. Agamben’s work from Stanzas to Use of Bodies and beyond to recent shorter works deactivates that distinction, the purely intellectual justification of which is something Primera quite brilliantly explicates even though he does not discuss the distinctively graceful confidence in tone and mood which has characterized Agamben’s writing throughout the years, and which has doubtless irritated many. For me, Agamben’s very tone is the ‘signature’ of his vocation as not strictly speaking philosophical or strictly speaking poetical. The ‘signature’ is the distinctive voice itself.

The second chapter, “Language and Being: The Work of Signatures” gets into the intellectual meat of this study whose overall originality concerns “the common-proper-indistinction — that explains the way in which signatures work”, that “allows us to grasp the internal logic that underpins the economy of the common and the proper”, and that guides “the relation between metaphysics, signification and ontology which is crucial to Agamben’s work” (36). Primera, closely following Watkin’s analyses, notes that, in Agamben’s works of archeological investigation ‘common’ and ‘proper’ are distinguished. After that, Agamben “examines the moments of indistinction, or zones of indifference in which both the common and the proper become indistinguishable” which in effect neutralizes a “metaphysical machine” (which produced the distinction in the first place) and opens “a politics freed from the economy of the common and the proper” (48). Primera is clear throughout his study that Agamben is no political fatalist. He concludes this important chapter by introducing “the archi-signator”, or the “hidden matrix upon which the very notion of thinking is established” (49). This would be Agamben’s “step-backwards-beyond metaphysics”, a full discussion of which he undertakes in the final chapter.

The third chapter explicates Agamben’s notion of sovereignty, his distinction from the decisionism of Schmitt and his embrace of Walter Benjamin’s “view of the state of exception as a space of undecidability” (52) — yet another of many, many steps-back-beyond that clear a space of inoperativity that is potentially liberating. It is in this chapter that Primera begins discussion of another product of the ‘machine’ that is western metaphysics: the figure of homo sacer, born of the Greek distinction between zoē and bios, for which Agamben has been frequently criticized as a poor reader of Aristotle by critics from Ernesto Laclau to J. Finlayson to Jussi Backman (in the invaluable volume edited by Adam Kotsko and Carlo Salzani, Agamben’s Philosophical Lineage [2017]). Primera wants to lay this scholarly controversy to rest saying that whether strictly speaking a misreading of Aristotle or not, it is “the specificity of political life (bios) as differentiated from animal life that founds zoē” (64), and, contra Finlayson, this distinction is not a straightforward historical event, but instead the distinction is an an-arche, that is to say, a lack of foundation. This is Primera at his most brilliant. As I understand it, Agamben reads philosophy, including political philosophy, deliberately indistinctly, as if interpreting poetry, as if what he is reading is exceptional text and, like sacred text, requiring further study. If this does not put off a reader, and Primera (like Zartaloudis, Watkin, and others) is not, then reading Agamben is an event that itself deactivates the poetry/philosophy distinction. Inspired by Primera, I myself now see that Agamben does not wish to dissolve the distinction, as if poetry and philosophy were essentially the same, nor abolish the distinction, as if each were antiquated and ought now to be ignored, nor overcome the distinction, as if Agamben has invented some new kind of discursiveness, but instead to preserve the distinctiveness of the distinction.

Chapters 4 and 5 explicate Agamben’s shift from the focus on sovereignty, characteristic of Schmitt, to government understood as an art of the management of power based on the notion of oikonomia, which Agamben subjects to a characteristically complex genealogy drawing on both political philosophy and theology in The Kingdom and the Glory [2007/2011]. Primera explicates the genealogy at length in rich intellectual detail and addresses critiques of Agamben’s method — namely, the ‘signature’, which is the thread that unites Primera’s overall understanding of Agamben. A characteristic critique is Alberto Toscano’s impatient complaint (quoted and addressed 104): “by what right does Agamben pass from the insistence of certain conceptual constellations and semantic kernels across different epochs and discursive formations to the overarching conviction that such an archaeological inquiry is of urgent political significance?” Primera does not specifically address the question of “right” but in this chapter he does further develop how we are to understand ‘signature’: “A signature, then, is not a concept or the hidden content of a concept but rather a process of transference whereby a concept or discourse is transposed from one domain to another”, and which “work[s] backwards through time” (102). Agamben himself, in his slim volume The Signature of All Things: On Method [2008/2009] writes, based on Paracelsus, that “the signature is not a causal relation. Rather, it is something more complex, something which has a retroactive effect on the signator” (35). Following Primera’s clear explications I wonder if we are to understand ‘signature’ as something like an aesthetic observation (but which is not an aesthetic observation) that re-orients historiography, liberating thought from various bipolar causal machines like the secular, the governmental, and the anthropological. Whether this is his “right” will vary from scholar to scholar.

Chapter 6 goes into the “Signature of Life: The Meaning of Bio-politics” which explicates Agamben’s obligation to and differences from Foucault; differences which “can only be fully grasped when examined in light of Agamben’s philosophical method” beginning with “signatures, paradigms and philosophical archaeology” together with “the structure of the common and the proper developed in Chapter 2” (111). As is characteristic of this book, the specific issue of bio-politics is situated “within a larger theoretical debate” (111). The conceptual net that Primera explicates very clearly in effect makes possible that the very concept of bio-politics (which produces and isolates homo sacer) may be deactivated by understanding life as a ‘signature’ “that refers the operations of power back to the logic of the common and the proper, through which a kind of life is excluded and whose exclusion, in the last instance, founds the political” (128). Thus, within the theoretical apparatus of the ‘signature’, Agamben activates life in such a way that it now opens a threshold beyond its capture within the bio-politics Foucault had over the years diagnosed.

The final chapter, “The Politics of Inoperativity”,  and its conclusions are based largely on The Use of Bodies, the volume which concludes the entire homo sacer project; a project the methodology of which depends, Primera shows, upon conceptual configurations first introduced in his early volumes such as Stanzas, The Coming Community [1990/1993], and Means Without End [1996/2000]. These configurations, only some threads of which I have touched on, and which are traced from those early volumes with patient concision in ways that have enlightened me and that are worthy of study to any student, critical or not, of Agamben.

Primera is led to conclude that, for Agamben, “politics is always ontological” (155), and thus the necessity of a “step back beyond metaphysics”. The step requires various theoretical apparatuses — of which ‘signature’ is primarily important. Primera demonstrates convincingly that these apparatuses, whose complicated interconnections constitute the whole of Agamben’s works across numerous terrains and epochs aside from bio-politics, are intellectually coherent and arguable. In the end, the archi-signator, spoken of in chapter 2, is life, whose politicization results in its isolation as homo sacer; in effect ‘bare life’, and whose potential “destituent power” is ‘form-of-life’: a notion Agamben takes from a few suggestive scraps in Wittgenstein, and which Primera examines as a “politics of inoperativity” (138-46), that is, as a deactivation of the bios/zoē separation. Primera does not flesh out what this space of “inoperativity” might be with anything like the intellectual dexterity with which he defends Agamben against his critics. Agamben himself does so in his The Highest Poverty [2011/2013], which examines the form-of-life issue in great detail and which introduces a distinction between rules and duty, the latter of which is taken up in Opus Dei [2012/2013], written at about the same time. Readers enthused by Primera’s volume ought to supplement their reading with these two by Agamben himself.

There is a great deal of work to be done explicating (and dare I say, appreciating, because his work is astonishing) Agamben’s overall significance by those who do not simply wish to dismiss him. The overall significance remains elusive, I believe, and I believe Agamben wishes it that way. Primera’s work on ‘signature’ and on Agamben’s political ontology is an important part of that labor.

(If there are subsequent editions, the Bloomsbury editors should correct a misprint in the extended quote on page 63: “zoēoe”; ‘Heideggerian’ is misspelled on page 32, and Agamben is misquoted near the top of page 31: “does” should read “thus”. What is more, the price of this highly useful book is absurdly high; Notre Dame Philosophical Review’s agreement to review it is salutary.)