The Political Philosophy of Cosmopolitanism

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Gillian Brock and Harry Brighouse (eds.), The Political Philosophy of Cosmopolitanism, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 272pp., $24.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521846609.

Reviewed by Mathias Risse, Harvard University


I sometimes think that, contrary to a certain advertisement, a true cosmopolitan is a drink after all. If you order one, you can have a good sense of what to expect, which is not true for philosophical cosmopolitanism. Consider how Brock and Brighouse introduce their topic. They divide political theorists into two camps, "those who consider national boundaries to have fundamental moral significance, and those who consider them to have no, or only derivative, moral significance" (p ix). But as these essays show, what it means for boundaries to have fundamental, derivative, or no significance is subject to such a variety of interpretations that cosmopolitans appear to share no more than a commitment to some form of universal moral equality.

For example, Tan rejects the objection that his view can accommodate national allegiances only if derived from "cosmopolitan" commitments by arguing that allegiances are limited by but not reducible to those commitments (pp 174-178). On this cosmopolitan view, national allegiances are fundamental. When the editors then stress that "[t]he crux of the idea of moral cosmopolitanism is that each human being has equal moral worth and the equal moral worth generates certain moral responsibilities that have universal scope" (p 4), the (ir)relevance of national allegiances (which seemed to demarcate cosmopolitanism) has gotten lost altogether. On this understanding, Nagel (2005), who limits considerations of justice to states and otherwise only allows for minimal humanitarian duties, is a cosmopolitan, and so is Rawls (1999), although he contrasts his own view with one he calls "cosmopolitan." And, really, what sensible view would now be excluded?

The contributors to this volume are David Held, Hillel Steiner, David Copp, Christine Sypnowich, Christopher Bertram, Thomas Pogge, Allen Buchanan, Richard Miller, Darrel Moellendorf, Kok-Chor Tan, Jocelyne Couture and Kai Nielsen, Martha Nussbaum, Jon Mandle, and Catriona McKinnon. Assembling them, the editors seek to develop a "positive political philosophy of cosmopolitanism" (p ix). But, as we saw, it is doubtful that there is a unified view aptly called "cosmopolitanism" that actually excludes a range of views on global justice that need to be taken seriously. By now, the field has digested the lesson that a successful justification of political entities (especially the state) cannot entirely disregard the concerns of those who do not belong to them. In light of this, the most sensible use of the term I can detect is for the position referred to as "strong cosmopolitanism" (p 3), according to which there can be no fundamental distributive principles within one society that fail to apply globally. But not all authors in this volume would support that view.

Space permits me to discuss only some of their contributions. I discuss them as independent contributions to questions of global justice, rather than to a view called "cosmopolitanism." It must be said that not all these essays make original contributions to the literature; they are, in fact, quite uneven in this regard. Much has been written on global justice, and new contributions should now take that into account to advance the debate. To illustrate, one position that has by now been well-articulated is that the state is not the exclusive domain of legitimacy. To make progress on the normative status of the state one needs to go beyond that conclusion, lest the reader is left wondering what has been accomplished at all. For instance, Held introduces principles capturing cosmopolitan values and two "meta-principles" from which to argue for them ("autonomy" and "impartialist reasoning"). He concludes that the state "withers away," a view Held qualifies by saying that what his argument delivers is merely that "states would no longer be regarded as the sole centers of legitimate power within their borders" (p 26). What do we learn? Buchanan refutes the view that it is permissible to determine foreign policy exclusively by national interest. He is self-conscious about offering such a refutation since he regards arguments to that effect as obvious (delivered by any form of recognition of human rights), and seems to think the interesting question is to explain why the refuted view persists. (This is a well-reasoned article, but one perhaps better placed in Foreign Policy, to find its appropriate audience.) So what Buchanan rightly finds obvious, given the state of the philosophical literature, Held derives from an elaborate argument. Again, at this stage of the discussion about the legitimacy of states we need more detail to find value in the conclusion that states are not the sole centers of legitimacy.

Tan argues that what he considers cosmopolitan justice and national allegiances can be reconciled. He discusses two objections, one mentioned above. The other is "that the subordination of nationality to cosmopolitan justice fails sufficiently to accommodate people's national allegiances" (p 166). The response is that it follows from an extension of our common understanding of justice to the global context, "that the … priority of (nationally) impartial justice over national allegiances derives necessarily from the purpose and concept of justice" (p 169). However, Miller convincingly argues that "cosmopolitan respect" is consistent with "patriotic concern." He offers two arguments for thus combining cosmopolitanism and patriotism. "The first is an argument from excessive costs in lost social trust, the second an argument from the need to provide compatriots with adequate incentives to obey the laws on helps to create" (p 134). Or consider other contributions: Blake (2001), Nagel (2005), and Risse (2006), all of which argue that there is something normatively peculiar about shared citizenship in a manner that turns on the particular kind of coerciveness exercised by states, but also acknowledge duties to those who do not belong to the state, duties easily captured by basic respect. So not much is gained from arguing that, on conceptual grounds, some general standpoint of global justice has priority over national allegiances. This is consistent with arguing that that global standpoint delivers the conclusion that individuals ought to acknowledge far-reaching duties to compatriots. It is unclear too, then, what we can learn from Tan's article.

In what remains I engage with three articles in some more detail (all of which develop views that are of some influence in the field at the moment). A rejection of Rawls's Law of Peoples is a rallying point for authors who see themselves as cosmopolitans, and here it is Nussbaum who is most explicitly negative about that work. Nussbaum states that Rawls "insists that this rough equality of the parties [in power and resources, MR] is an essential element in his theory, and is his own analogue to the idea of the State of Nature." (p 198) According to her, rough equality in strength determines who participates in the contract, which is crucial for her criticism of the Law of Peoples. However, as she also says, Rawls regards the state as fixed -- and the criterion of admission to the original position in which the contract regarding the basic structure of a fixed state is made is subjection to that state's coercive structures, that is, membership in that state, rather than equal strength. This point matters for an assessment of her main criticism of Rawls (1999).

Her main charge is this:

Either Rawls will have to admit that the principles and circumstances that bring societies together to form the second-stage bargain are very different from the Humean 'circumstances of justice,' with their focus on rough equality and mutual advantage, or he will stand firm on those conditions. (p 205)

In the first case, staggering inequalities can persist among states that are parties to the contract at the international level, but there can be no cooperation for mutual advantage. If Rawls instead stands with Hume, poor well-ordered societies should not be parties to the contract, although they are well-ordered and thus actually should be. Rawls should and can go with the first option. The criterion to admission to the contracts at the international level is not equal power; instead, the criterion is being a liberal or decent people, respectively. What characterizes liberal peoples is that they "limit their basic interests as required by the reasonable" (Rawls (1999), p 29), and this condition shapes what terms they offer to others. It is crucial for Rawls's version of the social contract that neither at the domestic level nor at the international level is the actual criterion of admission defined in terms of equal power.

We must not forget that we are talking about ideal theory here. When Nussbaum asks how (given the staggering inequalities among them) there could be the sort of cooperation envisaged by Rawls between the US on the one hand and India, Bangladesh, and South Africa, on the other, the answer will have to be that none of them currently satisfies the prescriptions of Rawlsian ideal theory. That is a lame response, but its lameness is due to the transition from ideal to non-ideal theory that occurs here, not to faults in the ideal theory, as Nussbaum argues.

Nussbaum also worries about Rawls's argument for the toleration of decent peoples. She takes Rawls to task for making this appeal through an analogy: in the domestic case, people of different comprehensive views must respect one another, so in the international case a spectrum of views must be tolerated, including some that are illiberal. Mandle deals with that same analogy, stating succinctly what the problem is:

If liberal principles of justice are the correct response to the presence of a diversity of reasonable comprehensive doctrines in the domestic case, why are not those same principles equally the correct response to the fact of reasonable diversity of comprehensive doctrines in the international case? (p 221)

Curiously, however, after dismissing Rawls's analogy, Nussbaum states that "Rawls clearly thinks that if we conclude that another nation has defective norms we will intervene, whether militarily or through economic and political sanctions" (p 207), which she finds objectionable because "[w]hen people join together to give laws to themselves, this is a human act that ought to be respected, even if the decision that is reached is one that is not fully justified from the moral point of view" (p 207). But indeed, as Mandle says, precisely that (rather than the aforementioned analogy uniformly rejected by critics) is the best way of understanding why Rawls argues for the toleration of decent societies: those are the societies in which it makes sense to think that "they," the people, have joined together and given themselves laws, which bestows legitimacy even on societies with "defective norms."

The reason why this allegedly deficient argument for toleration is important for Nussbaum is because she thinks it is partly in virtue of that domestic analogy that Rawls resists a more extensive list of human rights, and since this analogy fails, the road seems open to a more extensive list of human rights. But given the argument offered by Mandle, Rawls's resistance would be due to the fact that he ties human rights to legitimacy. Nussbaum is correct that loosening the connection between, as she puts it, the justification of human rights and their implementation can allow for a more expansive set of human rights than Rawls proposes. Still, we would not be sent searching for such a set on the grounds that Rawls merely offers a flawed analogy for his position; we would need to be persuaded of it independently. The Law of Peoples, then, can be defended against Nussbaum's objections. Whatever the merits of her own proposal (which I have not addressed), we are not pushed towards it merely because of failures in the contractarian approach, at least not to the extent that they show in Rawls's work.

Moellendorf thinks "[d]uties of justice arise among persons when their on-going association is largely non-voluntary and constitutes a significant part of the background for the various relationships of their public lives" (p 151), and do so on the basis of equal respect. Global economic relationships (trade, foreign investment, IMF, etc.) constitute such an association. Does this sort of association create duties? Rawls's account of the basic structure strikes Moellendorf as sufficiently similar to global economic structures to render duties applicable there. Yet this move (although also made by Beitz (1979) and Pogge (1989)) is unpersuasive because Rawls talks about the basic structure within the confines of a coercive state (cf. Blake (2001)). It requires additional arguments to show that the global economy coerces in anything like that sense to enlist Rawls. (As Nagel (2005) reminds us, strong incentives differ from coercion.)

Still, Moellendorf knows that the sheer presence of a global economic association does not settle the question of who has what sort of duty. Crucially, for him, economic relationships also bear on other aspects of what matters to persons and thereby generate duties among those involved in an economic association. First, basic liberties need to be secured because those are required "to realize the goods of economic association" (p 158), including freedom of contract and unionization. Second, the interests affected by economic associations are not purely economic, rather, "other fundamental moral interests are also affected, such as the ability of a person to live a life that is in significant ways chosen" (p 158). If democracies best protect those rights, those who share in the global economic association assume a duty to foster democratic regimes as well.

I am sympathetic to the view that trade involves us with distant strangers in ways that matter morally (see Risse (forthcoming)). Still, I am puzzled as to how such far-reaching duties could be derived from an economic association. We must not wrongfully harm others through our economic relationships; and trade can be a vehicle of discharging duties held independently. But the mere fact of being involved in economic structures does not engender a duty to ensure others can operate as economic agents fully endowed (vis-à-vis us as well as third parties) with rights as far-reaching as unionization. Economic relationships are of the wrong sort to generate such duties. And as we learn from Miller's piece, basic respect does not deliver them either.

Let me end with Pogge, who responds to critics of his 2002 book. I can here merely address responses to some objections I have made myself (see Risse (2005a-c), which formulate a view of the global order contrary in spirit to Pogge's). I have argued that in terms of just about all common indicators of human well-being, the world is now much better than it was in the middle of the 20th century, and about two centuries ago. The first time horizon matters because this covers the period since when we have had the kind of global coordination through which the global economic and political order has come into its own; the second is the period since when the industrial revolution has initiated technological advancements across the board that have spread through global interconnectedness and benefited just about everybody.

My claim regarding the improvement is true in terms of percentages of the world population. Pogge thinks percentages are inappropriate: "The killing of a given number of people does not become morally less troubling the more the world population increases. What matters morally is the number of people in extreme poverty" (p 92), of whom there are more now than ever. While, say, new insights about how many people were alive in 1945 cannot change our view of the Holocaust, what we are assessing here is the impact of a political and economic system on the world population. Suppose that at times t1 and t2 this system harms n people but in between the affected population has increased massively. We would then say that the impact of the system on the population has improved. While the number of people harmed has remained constant, the number of people benefiting from the system, or at least not harmed by it, has grown massively. If so, it is percentages that matter.

Another question is what the relevant benchmark for harm is to make it wrongful. I have argued that to the extent that assessing such a benchmark turns on counterfactuals about what the world would look like had there never been European expansion, we should suspend judgment. We normally evaluate counterfactuals by assessing what the world would be like were the antecedent true and by resorting to cases where some claim similar to the antecedent was true to evaluate its consequent. Assessing the relevant counterfactuals here is impossible, especially since much turns on exercises of the will of merely possible people. Pogge turns this into the following claim: "In the absence of conclusive proof that, without the horrors of European conquest, severe poverty worldwide would be substantially less today, Risse suggests, we are entitled to keep and defend what we possess, even at the cost of millions of deaths each year" (p 98). I suggest no such thing, and Pogge makes it sound as if the point were similar to claims of those who argue global warming has not been proven beyond reasonable doubt and thus nothing has to be done about it. Alas, the point is different, namely that we cannot make sense of those counterfactuals that Pogge appeals to here.

A different benchmark Pogge uses is a suitably defined state of nature. I have argued that state-of-nature references cannot help Pogge. They cannot distinguish between the view that the global order harms developing societies (his view), and any other explanation of radical inequality. Such references can only show that things are not as they should be, which does not bear on the question of blame. Pogge simply repeats his point:

However one may want to imagine a state of nature among human beings on this planet, one could not realistically conceive it as producing an enduring poverty death toll of 18 million annually. Only a thoroughly organized state of civilization can sustain horrendous suffering on such a massive scale. (p 99)

He offers no thoughts to refute the opposite claim, that only a "thoroughly organized state of civilization" prevents the annual death of many more in a population of 6.5 billion.

Finally, consider Pogge's claim that rich countries' protectionism "certainly account[s] for a sizable fraction of the 270 million poverty deaths since 1989" (p 105). Pogge forgets that subsidies for rich-country producers are ipso facto subsidies for consumers in countries without import barriers, and especially for consumers in net-food importing countries, which includes most least-developed countries. Removing subsidies would create a new constellation on the world market with new winners and losers. While all things considered removing them is desirable (see Risse (forthcoming)), subsidies have benefited many of the poorest. Without integrating these complexities into his argument, Pogge's stance on subsidies looks like mere political propaganda. More is needed.

In spite of my aforementioned reservations, I hope my engagement with some of the views represented in this volume has illustrated that global justice is an extremely exciting sub-field of political philosophy. Much is still worth doing there. Brock and Brighouse, and of course the contributors, deserve our gratitude for enriching some of the debates in this area.


Beitz, Charles. 1979. Political Theory and International Relations. Princeton: Princeton University Press

Blake, Michael. 2001. "Distributive Justice, State Coercion, and Autonomy." Philosophy and Public Affairs 30 (3): pp 257-297

Nagel, Thomas. 2005. "The Problem of Global Justice." Philosophy and Public Affairs 33 (2): pp 113-148

Pogge, Thomas. 1989. Realizing Rawls. Ithaca: Cornell University Press

Pogge, Thomas. 2002. World Poverty and Human Rights. Cambridge: Blackwell

Rawls, John. 1999. The Law of Peoples. Cambridge: Harvard University Press

Risse, Mathias. 2005a. "How Does the Global Order Harm the Poor?," Philosophy and Public Affairs, Vol. 33, No. 4: pp 349-376

Risse, Mathias. 2005b. "What We Owe to the Global Poor," The Journal of Ethics, Vol. 9, No. 1-2: pp 81-117

Risse, Mathias. 2005c. "Do We Owe the Poor Assistance or Rectification?," Ethics and International Affairs, Vol. 19, No. 1: pp 9-18

Risse, Mathias. 2006. "What to Say about the State." Social Theory and Practice, Vol, 32 (4): pp 671-698

Risse, Mathias. Forthcoming. "Fairness in Trade." Kennedy School of Government, Working Paper, No. RWP05-004