The Political Philosophy of Needs

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Hamilton, Lawrence A. , The Political Philosophy of Needs, Cambridge, 2003, 220pp, $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521827825.

Reviewed by Ron Terchek, University of Maryland


Lawrence Hamilton is unhappy with the way we identify and satisfy our needs. He does not provide a schedule of needs that must be addressed for every individual, but rather offers an elaborate theory heavily dependent on political sociology, political economy, and cognitive psychology. In the process, he gives us his views of true interests and realistic thinking about politics. If only we think correctly, the author seems to argue, we can at last get things straight. In The Political Philosophy of Needs, a work based on his doctoral dissertation, the author advances a fresh approach to needs which he wants us to make into the foundation of theorizing. He offers his approach as a way of overcoming the deficiencies he detects in contemporary theorizing. “If modern political theory,” he tells us, “embraced political sociology and political economy and rejected the dominance of moral philosophy it might begin to grasp the significant mechanisms that exist between certain forms of oppression and particular institutions and practices” (116). What he means to offer is an approach that bypasses rights and moral philosophy for something he holds is more analytically rigorous and political.

Theories of rights, the author tells us, have not only dominated thinking in contemporary political philosophy but have also diminished it. Rights, on his account, “entrench the status quo and endanger the need for political participation” (3). It turns out that Hamilton’s account of rights is a very conservative one and does not reach for a more generous rendition, one which speaks to the entitlements of individuals. But even if we take the author’s reading as legitimate, we still must wonder how we deal with rights as a conflict of good causes, when some meritorious rights conflict with other meritorious rights. Hamilton sees, for example, inheriting wealth as a dangerous right which thwarts the identifying and satisfying of needs. But there may be gradations to what can be bequeathed. Those with a modest home and small bank account may have a stronger claim to leave their estate to members of their family or a charity than those with considerable wealth. However we address the issue of inheritance in a democracy, this should be a matter of public debate and not something achieved by fiat or formula determined by Hamilton’s formula.

The problem with moral philosophy, we are told, is that it posits moral propositions a priori, but to shunt moral commitments off the table in advance seems to deplete both theorizing and politics of much of the material on which it rests. The author’s approach to morality also ignores the reality that almost all propositions fail to command a consensus and are therefore subject to the kinds of debate and contention that someone such as Stuart Hampshire in Justice Is Conflict thinks is central to a good democratic politics. Although Hamilton correctly observes that the language of rights often makes citizens into jural subjects and can underplay conflict, he misses an important point that much American politics is steeped in the language of rights and the subject of intense political controversy and conflict, as Mary Glendon carefully demonstrates in Rights Talk. The contest between those who support the right to choice and those who favor the right to life exemplify this phenomena. It is also helpful to recognize that some conceptions of rights are important normative resources in addressing some of the very things that move Hamilton. For all of its deficiencies, the concept of universal human rights has sometimes been used to galvanize peoples and governments against egregious wrongs.

For his part, the author argues repeatedly that there are no objective needs that can be identified in advance. Hamilton correctly observes that such solutions remove the point of politics (65). His “categorization of needs includes needs as drives, goals, and the necessary elements of human functioning.” His different categories of needs are meant to “correspond to different moments in everyday human existence, the beings and doings of humans” (60). Hamilton’s three categories of needs are “Vital Needs … that are the general ineluctable needs that are unproblematically associated with individual health.” The second category deals with “Particular Social Needs … [that] are the particular contingent manifestations of needs that are the focus of public policy, and those that are perceived and felt as needs, as ineluctable, and yet are seen to be of private concern” (23). “Agency Needs … are the general ethical and political objectives of individuals and groups” (24). Hamilton’s agency needs “provide the feelings of safety, self-esteem, confidence (and courage) that provide individuals with the ability to function fully, individually, and politically” (35). Autonomy is a critical part of Hamilton’s agency needs and he wants us to think of it as “a question of the degree of acquired level of power” (45). This understanding, he tells us, moves us away from a Kantian notion of autonomy, which sees us as either free or unfree. But much of the recent literature on autonomy has accepted what the author claims is new, namely that autonomy rests on a continuum. The work of Joseph Raz is particularly helpful here.

Hamilton recognizes that many things get in the way of identifying and promoting needs. One has to do with advertising which teaches people that they need certain things that are either irrelevant to their well-being or indeed are antithetical to their well-being. He finds that patterns of production and consumption are also complicit in the generation of contemporary needs. He sees the ready availability of automobiles with poor fuel economy and the relative absence of automobiles with excellent fuel economy, for example, as skewing the satisfaction of needs. Many might claim that this leads to manipulation, but Hamilton thinks the operative process is coercion, and the reason is that coercion means being “left with no reasonable alternative but Q” (141). This is an expansive view of coercion, but one that frequently hides the most abusive forms of the phenomena, for example of the use of torture to exact information comes to mind.

Ideally, Hamilton tells us, the state should be the exclusive repository of coercion (110). He has a “state of needs” in mind, and because of the scope of its duties and ultimate coercive power, it is helpful to quote him at length: “The state of needs would be a constant participant in the disclosure and evaluation of needs, interests, institutions, and need trajectories and simultaneously the agency that ultimately decides when and how to act on the extant information in order to transform institutions and role matrices, choose trajectories, prioritise needs, and allocate resources in line with these choices and priorities” (134). The state of needs will be conducting two kinds of inventories regarding needs. One is an annual census that avoids “spurious and dubious concerns such as identity or how long one has been out of work.” Rather it will consider (1) the roles an individual occupies and the freedom that resides in those roles and (2) the “objective state of one’s vital and agency need development, for example, the quality and quantity of one’s food, exercise, [and] participation in politics” (127). The second inventory would occur over one month every ten years in order to examine long-term choices and amend or augment existing inventories in light of changing conditions (157).

Citizens will participate in these evaluative procedures but, Hamilton warns us, we should “not make the normal mistake of conflating participation with deliberation” (158). For him, participation entails “having the means and resources to cognise, meet, and criticise needs in everyday contexts” (158). We also learn that majorities will determine outcomes, but read on to find that “the local arm of the state must be able to adjust the outcome of the final decisions dependent on its appraisal of normative power balances and publicly available evidence of justified need … . This is especially important when and where there is a split vote, distortions in turnout, or very low turnout” (158). This might strike many as shortchanging democracy in critical ways, and it does; it may also carry a paternalistic bent, and the author agrees. Hamilton, criticizing liberals for being too frightened of paternalism, embarks on a defense of the phenomena. He means to show that some forms of paternalism “are not only benign but also necessary to human functioning” (167).

Early on in this review, I mentioned that Hamilton rejects rights theory because it is a priori. What he offers in its place is a very formal and not always lucid a priori methodology. What is particularly disturbing is how much Hamilton’s process is prepared to discount democracy and deliberation and invite the paternalism of experts to have sway. Hamilton might object to this reading because experts do not appear on his stage. But his procedures are so complex and opaque only those with highly sophisticated technical skills will be able to implement them for the “state of needs.” The evaluation of “true interests” that he proposes for his “state of needs” assumes his formula gives us correct answers, thus denying alternative readings of “true interests” (144). With such an approach, he leaves no room for the contestation that a variety of democrats from Hannah Arendt to Norberto Bobbio think is at the heart of democracy.

An ambitious approach to a neglected topic, The Political Philosophy of Needs offers some interesting and innovative ideas. However, the work seems unnecessarily formal and dogmatic. Readers wanting a humanistic approach to the subject would profitably consult Michael Ignatieff’s The Needs of Strangers or Stephen Salkever’s discussion of Aristotle’s view of the multiplicity of needs in Finding the Mean.