The Political Problem of Religious Pluralism: And Why Philosophers Can't Solve It

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Thaddeus J. Kozinski, The Political Problem of Religious Pluralism: And Why Philosophers Can't Solve It, Lexington Books, 2010, 261pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780739141687.

Reviewed by Brendan Sweetman, Rockhurst University


Liberal political philosophers have struggled with several well-known problems, not least among them the problem of legitimacy. This is the tension that results from not taking a position on the truth of any particular worldview or view of the good -- of even adopting an essentially skeptical and relativistic approach to ultimate matters of truth and value -- and yet at the same time attempting to specify principles and values that would provide the foundations of the modern, pluralist, democratic state and that would apply to every worldview in that state. These principles and values would restrict the practice of some worldviews (especially religious ones) and would favor others (especially secularist ones). As a result, advocates of religious worldviews have often been sharply critical of contemporary liberal political theory. Kozinski's book is a contribution to this debate. He writes from the perspective of one who is interested in the relationship between Catholicism and democracy. He also explores how a Catholic thinker who accepts that Catholicism is the correct worldview should respond to the ideas of political liberalism and, more generally, should handle the relationship between Catholicism and democracy. Many important thinkers within the Catholic tradition have addressed these questions, including John Courtney Murray, Jacques Maritain, Alasdair MacIntyre, Tracey Rowland, Robert Kraynak, Gary Gutting and William Cavanaugh, and so this book takes its place within this larger discussion.

The author focuses on three thinkers at the heart of this particular debate: John Rawls, Maritain and MacIntyre. The book is divided into three parts, with two chapters in each part devoted to the work of each thinker. Part I lays out and critiques Rawls's political theory, the main foundation for political liberalism. This section sets the scene for the discussion in the rest of the book. Part II examines Maritain's political philosophy, which some see as a reasonable alternative to Rawls's view, but of which Kozinski is finally critical. Part III provides a comprehensive exposition of MacIntyre's work, with which the author has much sympathy because of MacIntyre's preference for the Aristotelian/Thomistic approach to the good. Yet Kozinski also finally rejects MacIntyre's approach as a viable alternative to political liberalism. Toward the end, the author also surveys and offers critical reflections on the views of other important thinkers, including Gutting, Jeffrey Stout, and John Milbank. He concludes with a very short sketch of a possible way forward on the problems facing liberal pluralism. Overall the book is very good on exposition and critique, and indeed it will serve as a reliable introduction to the political views of a wide range of leading contemporary thinkers. However, Kozinski's study is weaker on original ideas with regard to the problems it is raising and is often quite repetitive. More worrying is Kozinski's implicit suggestion at the end of the book that theology is prior to philosophy in the order of knowledge, and so in political philosophy. I will come back to this point later.

In the opening chapters Kozinski argues, correctly in my view, that Rawls's theory is fatally flawed because, while Rawls claims not to be taking a position on the question of which "comprehensive conception of the good" should be the foundation of the state, his theory still biases the state towards liberal worldviews and against religious worldviews (p. 5). Religious views must be excluded, according to the Rawlsian view, because they are not based on grounds or arguments that all citizens could reasonably accept given certain assumptions, such as the fact of reasonable pluralism and specific interpretations of freedom and equality in individual decision-making. Rawls's failure, and the contortions of many liberal political thinkers since Rawls (especially Ronald Dworkin and Robert Audi) to try to save his view from this important criticism and yet still insist on no role for religion in public life, has led many, especially those who hold religious conceptions of the good, to conclude that there is something fundamentally wrong with political liberalism.

Although Kozinski does identify one of the main problems facing Rawls's view -- that he ends up privileging his own theory of the good in a supposedly "neutral" state -- he does not sufficiently bring out some of the deeper problems facing Rawls's approach and, especially, their implications for religion. These problems are twofold. First, Rawls accepts as a starting point that there is no way of settling on the true view of the good (which from a practical point of view means there is no true view). So he develops a political theory that reflects this fact. Anyone who disagrees with this foundationalist move will be strongly discouraged from expressing their view publicly and politically (even though they have free speech) because they are "unreasonable" according to the standards of "reasonable pluralism." This latter point means that one should not try to present public arguments that others could "reasonably reject" (this is why some argue that religious arguments should have no role in public life). Leaving aside the notoriously difficult matter of settling on an objective definition of "reasonable," many have pointed out that this is just one more view of the good, and why should it be privileged over the others?

But, second, even if one were to deny that this is a view of the good in itself, nevertheless Rawls's theory still contains foundational values that he does believe to be true and that he wants to impose on others who disagree with them. As a way around this second problem, the later Rawls resorts to values that "we all nowadays accept," values that are latent in our political tradition, which commits him to a form of cultural relativism. (Despite the fact that "tradition" is one of those reasons that liberals -- such as Audi -- generally find unacceptable in other contexts -- such as religious ones -- as the basis for public arguments.) Perhaps in the end something akin to the approach of the later Rawls is the best liberal political philosophers can offer in defense of their foundational principles. But note again that it must be Rawls's version of the political tradition that provides the foundations and not someone else's version (we are not usually talking about a non-liberal alternative, but a liberal alternative that differs from Rawls's, on the interpretation of freedom and equality, for example).

By not dwelling on these deeper points, Kozinski ends up describing Rawls's view as "theological" to convey the point that it only has the appearance of neutrality, while actually privileging certain (restrictive) values all along (p. 37). However, this language is misleading. While it can be useful in certain contexts to talk this way, especially if one wishes to emphasize that a view like Rawls's is just another worldview (a "religion," if you will), the term "theological" is confusing because it seems to sidestep the question of the need to justify one's foundationalist views. The problems Rawslianism runs into shows above all else that there is always a requirement to justify one's political theory, and, especially in the context of Kozinski's approach, this brings us back to philosophy as the primary discipline. This issue will become crucial when Kozinski comes to sketching his own solution to the problem of pluralism.

Kozinski next turns to Maritain, who also embraces democratic pluralism, but who offers a more conventional, more honest, and more logical attempt at justifying it. Maritain argues that one cannot avoid offering a philosophical justification for one's democratic political theory that is based upon one's view of the good. Yet he acknowledges that democratic values such as popular sovereignty, freedom, equality and justice, at least in a general sense, can gain consensus even though individuals might justify them by appeal to different conceptions of the good. Kozinski points out, importantly, that Maritain regards divisions and disagreements over political and moral values within this general framework as a misfortune, which we must eventually transcend, unlike Rawls, who appears to welcome differences without facing up to their ultimate consequences for society. Maritain grounds his view in "universal and objective truth … [and his] is an unapologetically and unequivocally foundationalist project" (p. 57). Of course, Kozinski has argued that Rawls's view is foundationalist as well. But unlike Rawls, Maritain would explicitly found the political state on a view of the good -- a Catholic, specifically,Thomistic, view with a heavy appeal to natural law -- but would not require citizens to subscribe to this theoretical conception, as long as we could reach practical agreement on the basic values of a just and democratic state, his "democratic charter" (p. 61).

Could an approach like Maritain's work as an alternative to Rawls's, even if one did not adopt Maritain's specific view of the good? This depends, in part, on what we mean by "work." If we mean "find consensus," then Kozinski argues that it would not work, since even at the practical level there would be much disagreement about the application of the values and even about the values themselves that flow from the foundations of Maritain's view of the good. Yet this may be true of any political theory since, after all, Rawls's view does not work either, and its failure is indicative of a deeper problem for democratic pluralism: that it may not be possible to reach consensus in the end. Perhaps the only way to achieve a superficial agreement is by forcing one's values on people in various ways, by pretending that the foundations are "neutral," or through the ballot box, or by suppressing opposing views in subtle and not so subtle ways, or (especially in the U.S. context) through the law courts.

This problem raises the question of whether a view like Maritain's, and indeed any religious view, could really be at home in a free society at all. Maritain has a very positive view of democracy and basically holds (controversially) that Christianity, and specifically Catholicism, has been leading historically to democracy, a view held by some others (like Richard John Neuhaus). But there is often a tension between Christianity and democracy, because in the former we have what is supposed to be an objectively true view of the good that can serve as the foundation of the state, yet one of the key values in the latter is freedom, the exercise of which would presumably allow citizens to question, and perhaps even reject, the foundations! The tension occurs in the relationship between truth and freedom, with the worry being that freedom operates as a de facto higher value than truth. One can argue that freedom will lead to the truth, but this is by no means obvious and has been questioned by several Catholic thinkers like Kraynak and Cavanaugh. This discussion draws attention to the more ultimate question as to how central freedom is to the nature of man.

Kozinski is correct to point out that Maritain accepts the modern view that freedom is a key feature of human nature and so would suggest a democratic state as the most natural political expression of this feature (rather than just a workable system), whereas traditional approaches did not accord such a high place to freedom. But then we must ask how freedom itself is justified. This is a question each worldview must face (and we have noted the problems liberal political theory runs into here), but it is one which is especially important for religious thinkers, since they are not skeptical about truth in the way that liberal political philosophers are and yet at the same time they want to acknowledge that freedom is a very important (if not the highest) value. Kozinski's study skirts around these issues but never comes to terms with them. He does not seem to appreciate that this question is also closely linked to the issue of the correct way to justify a religious worldview, and so to the relationship between philosophy and theology.

Can the work of MacIntyre help throw new light on any of these fundamental questions? MacIntyre agrees that political liberalism is dishonest because, while claiming to be neutral between various views of the good, it actually requires and inculcates a liberal view of the good, and specifically a normative view of pluralism (p. 138). MacIntyre believes that, against Rawls, pluralism can never be regarded as reasonable because it leads to disagreement (due also in part to the widespread presence of ethical emotivism in our culture) and almost requires normative pluralism as a result of its official commitment to skepticism about the good. According to Kozinski, MacIntyre thinks that liberalism is responsible for the disagreements in modern culture because it prevents the full expression of human rationality due to its rejection of any teleological account of human beings. It is also incoherent because on the one hand it encourages moral disagreement while on the other claiming that it can lead to a secure, reasoned consensus (p. 143).

What is MacIntyre's alternative? Kozinski provides an exhaustive exposition of MacIntyre's main themes, focusing on the thesis that rational inquiry depends upon a tradition and that, despite this, the Aristotelian/Thomistic tradition is superior because of its emphasis on, and account of, the intrinsic relationships between human telos, practices, virtues and narrative (p. 146). The problems facing MacIntyre's claim that all rational inquiry depends on a tradition have been much discussed and there is no need to rehearse them here, the main one being the relativistic tendencies of such a move and the difficulty in overcoming them. How can one really offer a critique of political liberalism if one argues from the stand point that rationality is tradition-dependent? Won't this approach lead to the very pluralism one is trying to avoid and also undermine any attempt to deal with the problem of pluralism at the same time? Unfortunately, Kozinski has no sustained discussion of this problem and in fact barely mentions it. This is very surprising given that he provides a very helpful overview of "pragmatic liberalism" (a view developed by Gutting and Stout, among others): a sophisticated, postmodern attempt to come to terms with the relativism and pluralism of our political tradition, while yet showing how we can still have rational inquiry, objective political norms, and a shared moral life (p. 212). Kozinski clearly brings out the logical and practical problems such a view runs into, which are not all that different from those facing MacIntyre.

Kozinski concurs with the view of other critics of MacIntyre, such as Catherine Pickstock, that MacIntyre's actual state would still look very like a liberal political state. This is because, although he believes the Aristotelian/Thomistic tradition best captures the embodiment of the good for human beings, nevertheless, because of his desire to secure and preserve the autonomous exercise of communal rationality, he eschews large-scale social embodiment of conceptions of the good. Pickstock argues that this is just "liberalism to a higher order," and Kozinski concludes that MacIntyre's state "would be bereft of a substantive conception of the good as in the liberal one, and would be charged merely with managing the activity between individual traditions, as distinct from individual persons" (p. 198), and this would leave us no better off than before.

At the end of the book, Kozinski sketches how he thinks we can resolve the problems which dog all of these approaches. He, along with Milbank, suggests that the problem with political philosophy, and indeed philosophy in general, is that it is fundamentally liberal (and secular) because it excludes theological content (p. 233). He argues that our political system must be based on theological claims, and so philosophers are always at a disadvantage when engaging in political philosophy. But Kozinski gives no thought to how we will deal with the well-known problem facing this view. This is a problem which modern political philosophers, for all their faults, have well identified: how to justify the theological claims in a way that still respects people's freedom. This question surely means that philosophy must come before theology, otherwise we appear to open the door to irrationalism. It does not mean, as liberal political philosophers have routinely interpreted it to mean, that religious beliefs are not rational or can't be the foundation of political beliefs, but only that if they are, they must be defended philosophically. (And when they are defended philosophically, they won't run into problems any worse than the problems of political liberalism.)

If we couple this point with the recognition that secularism is now a major influential worldview in modern culture, this further undermines the whole notion of liberal "neutrality" and also the temptation to equate reason (or "secular reason") with political liberalism (and so with the implication that religious views have no place in "enlightened" political life). This approach will not solve the difficult problem of pluralism (if indeed it can be solved) without somehow excluding views one does not agree with, but at least it has the virtue of attempting to justify openly one's views rationally and objectively. For this reason philosophy in the area of human knowledge (and in political philosophy) must be prior to theological truth, even though in the order of objective truth, it could be the other way around.

Kozinski provides an impressive exposition and critique of three very important thinkers on the deepest issues of political philosophy, and his study will take its place in the literature as a critique of liberal political theory, especially from a Catholic perspective. He asks many interesting questions but does not make a sufficient attempt to answer them, and we await a more comprehensive study of these matters from an Aristotelian/Thomistic, and more broadly Catholic, perspective. I recommend his book for courses dealing with MacIntyre and liberal political theory, Catholicism and democracy, and religion and politics.


Audi, Robert (2000), Religious Commitment and Secular Reason, Cambridge University Press.

Cavanaugh, William T., (2009), The Myth of Religious Violence, Oxford University Press.

Gutting, Gary (1999), Pragmatic Liberalism and the Critique of Modernity, Cambridge University Press.

Kraynak, Robert (2001), Christian Faith and Modern Democracy, University of Notre Dame Press.

MacIntyre, Alasdair (1990), Three Rival Versions of Moral Inquiry, University of Notre Dame Press.

Milbank, John (1993), Theology and Social Theory: Beyond Secular Reason, Blackwell.

Pickstock, Catherine, "Liturgy, Art and Politics," Modern Theology (April 2000), pp. 159-180.

Rawls, John (1996), Political Liberalism, Columbia University Press.

Rowland, Tracey (2003), Culture and Thomist Tradition after Vatican II, Routledge.

Sweetman, Brendan (2006), Why Politics Needs Religion: The Place of Religious Arguments in the Public Square, InterVarsity Press.

Weithman, Paul J. (1997 ed.), Religion and Contemporary Liberalism, University of Notre Dame Press.