The Political Thought of Jacques Rancière: Creating Equality

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Todd May, The Political Thought of Jacques Rancière: Creating Equality, Pennsylvania State University Press, 2008, 196pp., $32.50 (pbk), ISBN 9780271034508.

Reviewed by Miguel Vatter, Universidad Diego Portales


Todd May is one of the first English language interpreters of French poststructuralist thought to have shown the importance of this tradition for radical democratic political theory. He did so back when it was fashionable in some circles to dismiss Foucault, Derrida, Lacan and others as being anti- or a-political. His new book argues that Rancière's thought offers an alternative path for democratic politics than the one presented by egalitarian liberalisms. In reality, the book is less an in-depth interpretation of Rancière than it is a plaidoyer for the claim that democratic politics belongs within the tradition of anarchism, as opposed to those of liberalism or Marxism. May brings together two quite distinct understandings of anarchism. The first, which arguably characterizes much French poststructuralist thought, attempts to connect radical democratic theory to a "principle of anarchy."[1] Rancière's thought would be one example among many that wrestles with the great and still unresolved problem of how such an antinomian principle should be understood. In this French poststructuralist sense, anarchy means the absence of a metaphysical foundation for the distinction between who rules and who is ruled (that is, the necessary failure of all hegemonic principles of legitimacy of rule). But it also refers to a no less antinomian "ontological" privileging of a "materialism of events" over an "idealism of forms." The second sense of anarchism at issue in May's book concerns the tradition of late 18th and 19th century classical anarchism from Godwin to Kropotkin, and its rejection of both Marxism and liberalism. May's book attempts to harness the philosophical and political potentialities withheld by the first sense of poststructuralist anarchy for the sake of advancing the program of classical anarchism.

I suspect that one of the motivations for this book is ultimately polemical. In the last decade, post-Marxist theorists like Badiou, Žižek, Laclau, and others have employed poststructuralist anarchy, in the sense described above, for the purpose of revitalizing the connection between Marxism and a revolutionary (but not necessarily "democratic") politics. I read May's book as a sort of response to this challenge which employs Rancière's thought to argue for a return to democratic politics from the standpoint of classical, anti-Marxist anarchism. In what follows I shall quickly review what May has to say regarding Rancière's thought proper, and then raise a few questions about the strategy he employs in carrying out his polemical goal.

Of the five chapters of this book, only the second one, strictly speaking, is a presentation of Rancière's political thought. May's core intuition is that Rancière allows us to think "actively" or "creatively" about equality, whereas liberal egalitarianism (Rawls, Nozick, Sen, and Marion Young are named here) forces us to conceive of equality as "passive". Roughly speaking, passive equality is about distributing something (rights, opportunities, capabilities, etc.) equally to someone (for liberals, this someone is an individual endowed with personhood). This distribution is done by an agent other than the subject (usually the state) and with respect to the equality so established, the subject of the distribution remains passive and unpolitical (chapter 1).

On May's account, Rancière instead proposes to think about equality actively. Equality is about the subject participating in equalizing him/herself with all others. Active equality is doing-equality rather than having-equality, and it is formative of the subject. Employing Rancière's term, creating equality is a process of subjectivization, not individualization. This is the sort of equality that characterizes a democratic politics because it works on the presupposition that everyone is the equal of everyone else. Democratic politics occurs when people who are not reckoned with as equals decide to demonstrate their equality with everyone else. The presupposition of universal equality has a negative and a positive expression. Negatively, it means that there are no "good" reasons for any stable division of the distinction between rulers and ruled; positively, it means that everyone is equally intelligent, in the sense of equally capable of participating in the "government" of society (chapter 2). The anarchic character of many of Rancière's formulations for democracy is pretty clear, and on the basis of such evidence May constructs a bridge to classical 19th century anarchism in its struggle against both Marxism and liberalism (chapter 3).

Another component of May's argument concerns the normative force of the demonstration of universal equality. If equality is about distributive justice, then those to whom something is to be given equally must already count as parts of society. Rancière argues that every such counting necessarily leaves some parts of society outside the count, that is, without participation in the society. To think about equality actively means to dissent from the distribution of parts established by those who are in power (those who dominate) in the name of the wrong done to the parts which have no part. These parts without participation demonstrate their equality to the counted parts, and in so doing bring into contradiction the principles of the distribution with the actual distribution. For May, an active politics of equality has a fundamental normative or ethical component insofar as the demonstrating uncounted parts of society are forcing the counted parts to live up to their own normative principles of distributive justice (chapter 4).

May's claim that the politics of dissensus has a normative structure seems to introduce the possibility that between distributive and democratic, passive and active equality there may in the end exist a sort of division of labor, or, at least, a modus vivendi such that the two worlds they designate (the world of the counted, the world of the excluded) somehow hold together in a polity. On this point, May disagrees with Rancière: for there to be such a common world between those who are in and those who are out, it must be possible for the dissensus of democratic politics to be institutionalized; such politics cannot remain eventual, sporadic, uncontrollable, in short, anarchic (chapter 5).

May's book is well-written and clear. It is a welcome attempt to establish the importance of anarchy (in its various senses) for contemporary political theorizing, a project with which I am myself in sympathy. Nevertheless, to my mind the book has two weaknesses. First, it seems to me that despite his well-known break with Althusser, Rancière's thought remains interwoven with much of the political thought that emerged out of Althusser's "school," which includes not only his students and collaborators (Balibar, Badiou, etc.) but also philosophers like Derrida and Foucault, who remained personally close to Althusser, and were at different moments influenced by him (as well as vice versa). Thus it does not seem fair to Rancière to project his thought onto a binary opposition between Marxism and anarchism. Rancière never intimates, to my knowledge, that the latter tradition is superior to that of Marxism. One should also mention the influence on his development of philosophers like Lefort, Castoriadis and Lyotard who belonged to the opposite camp of "Socialisme ou Barbarie". I fear that by not offering such a genealogical reconstruction of Rancière's intellectual context, this book falls short of the challenge posed by Badiou, Žižek, Laclau et al. with respect to the way they want to connect poststructuralist anarchy to revolutionary politics (and against what May calls democratic politics). This lack of a proper engagement with theoretical opponents becomes noticeable particularly with regard to the problematic of "form vs. event" (or "being vs. event") which May leaves completely undeveloped. Perhaps this is also why the book ends up sounding more liberal and reformist than it intends to be when May defends the possibility of giving democratic politics a stable institutional form.

The second problem I find with May's treatment of equality concerns his discourse on liberty. The general argument is that liberalism tends to privilege individual liberty over equality, even in liberal egalitarianism. The "communist anarchism" defended by May, on the other hand, while holding onto liberty as absolutely fundamental (and understanding liberty as non-domination), nevertheless privileges equality over liberty because the presupposition of everyone's "equal intelligence" is required "to create a meaningful life" (91). What falls completely by the wayside in this debate between egalitarian liberalism and communist anarchism is the tradition of modern revolutionary republicanism. The conception of freedom as non-domination, before being taken up by 19th century anarchism (but also by Marx) was an invention of republicanism, not liberalism, as has been plainly made evident by contemporary debates. Equal liberty was the rallying call of republicanism against the liberal belief that the liberty of everyone should be protected by virtue of the natural equality of all individuals. For republicanism, equality must be created; for liberalism, it is always given (in this sense, I agree with May). Furthermore, there is a direct relation between republicanism and anarchism because a republic entails the abolition of the distinction between ruler and ruled, that is, a republic is characterized by what Arendt calls no-rule (a direct translation of an-arche). Lastly, as Althusser recognized towards the end of his life, the connection between democratic politics (a politics that turns around the power of the people, i.e., of active equality) and events (rather than forms or institutions) was first made by Machiavelli, the father of modern republicanism. It is a pity that republicanism does not figure in May's book. In my opinion, the best chance to recover the "lost treasure" of the unity of state and revolution, rule of law and power of the people, equality and liberty, comes from the reconstruction of the subterranean and subversive traditions of revolutionary republicanism from which both Arendt and Foucault draw, and whose traces are clearly visible in so many of Rancière's brilliant reformulations of democratic politics.

[1] The expression comes from Reiner Schürmann, Le principe d'anarchie. Heidegger et la question de l'agir (Paris: Seuil, 1982), one of the first theoretical attempts to connect the post-metaphysical critique of foundations (arche) to the political sense of anarchy (an-arche, absence of rule). Todd May has himself contributed to this literature, e.g. in The Political Philosophy of Poststructuralist Anarchism (University Park, PA: Penn State Press, 1994).